Merleau-Ponty and Derrida: Intertwining Embodiment and Alterity

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Jack Reynolds, Merleau-Ponty and Derrida: Intertwining Embodiment and Alterity, Ohio University Press, 2004, 208pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0821415921.

Reviewed by Dorothea Olkowski, University of Colorado


First among the concerns expressed by Jack Reynolds in Merleau-Ponty and Derrida: Intertwining Embodiment and Alterity is a concern for the direction of philosophy. Philosophers from Wittgenstein to Heidegger and Rorty have participated in positing the necessity of a new direction. Twentieth-century French philosophers, it is noted, have participated in this effort primarily by means of the "denigration of the tradition," disparagingly tracing the lineage of Western thought from Parmenides to Kant. Phenomenology and deconstruction are, according to Reynolds, two of the leading alternative approaches, approaches that presumably participate in the denigration of tradition while, at the same time, proposing new directions. Given these statements, it is somewhat surprising, therefore, that this book is not particularly concerned with new directions, focusing instead on the ways in which the thoughts of French philosophers Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Jacques Derrida intersect. Given the frequent references to Wittgenstein, along with the author's apparent discontent over the "preoccupation with the history of philosophy … [that] almost inevitably insists that phenomenology is but the last gasp of metaphysics," it makes sense that the general approach in this book is about specific thoughts, that is, it is problem-based.

Part One is dedicated to the problem of embodiment and Part Two takes up the question of the Other. Embodiment is read quite broadly so that Part One includes discussions of embodiment, intellectualism (interpreted as analytic thought), the proximity of the mind-body opposition to that of speech-writing, the presumed deconstructive turn of the later Merleau-Ponty, and a comparison (mostly favorable) of the concepts of habituation and undecidability. Part Two veers off in the direction of the two philosophers' relations to other philosophers of their time -- Merleau-Ponty and Sartre, Derrida and Levinas -- eventually reuniting Merleau-Ponty and Derrida in the sameness and difference of the phenomenological concept of reversibility.

The book opens by addressing the question of the denigration of the body in philosophy and the recuperation of embodiment in the philosophy of Merleau-Ponty. The author's position, that Merleau-Ponty has not been given the attention loaded on other French philosophers, is debatable; perhaps it depends on where one looks. Reynolds argues that the remedy for this is an account of the body-subject, Merleau-Ponty's major attempt to overcome mind-body dualism. The account given, here and throughout the book, while largely accurate, is heavily dependent on a few well known secondary sources but omits most accounts of embodiment and intersubjectivity that are equally familiar to feminist philosophers, notably those of Iris Marion Young, Gail Weiss, Shannon Sullivan, Sonia Kruks, Luce Irigaray and even Simone de Beauvoir. The remaining chapters in Part One are structured so as to explicate various Derridean concepts, followed by arguments why corresponding concepts in Merleau-Ponty are not all that different from the Derridean position. The reader is left with the impression that Derrida is the standard for "new directions," and Merleau-Ponty must be made to accommodate. Thus the problem of "speech-writing" is defended as encompassing that of the "body-mind." In this chapter Vicki Kirby's brilliant text, Telling Flesh, is quickly run through and dismissed precisely for proposing that language and embodiment are not exclusive structures but reside within a more general structure called différence. Exactly how this embodied deconstruction differs from Reynold's own solution is not apparent.

Beyond this, Reynolds is among those philosophers who argue that The Visible and the Invisible involves a deconstructive turn with a phenomenological twist. For example, he argues that Derrida prioritizes writing over speech, body over mind, while simultaneously seeking to corrupt and contaminate that opposition, while Merleau-Ponty's chiasmatic ontology insiunuates that dualisms are already corrupted. Likewise, it is argued that for Derrida, there is blindness at the center of any point of view, thus that the artist, for example, is necessarily blind. This is said to correspond to the Merleau-Pontean position that only in the fold between the sentient and the sensible is experience possible. Even the Derridean concept of undecidability has a Merleau-Pontean equivalent, surprisingly, in the concept of habituation. Although he recognizes a difference of emphasis between the two conceptions (the latter oriented toward continuity, the former toward discontinuity), Reynolds insists that insofar as habitual action is not without divergence (écart), it does not, in the end, fall under the critique of the metaphysics of presence. Moreover, Derrida should have been willing to admit that decision-making always involves some interdependence of bodies and environment tending toward equilibrium.

With these commensurabilities in place, the reader should be well prepared for the second part of the volume in which a leader-follower relation is once again laid out. The claim is made first that abstract, retrospective, and rational reflection carries the burden of responsibility for self-other dichotomies that lead Sartre's search for authentic behavior to the disquieting limitations of either solipsism or the master-slave dialectic. Even a philosophy of embodiment encounters serious difficulty in overcoming these ends. Perhaps the most we can expect is the recognition of the ambiguous situation of a body-subject, both immanent and transcendent, the subject of lived experience. At first it is asserted that to compare Derrida and Merleau-Ponty on the problem of alterity is to think about the ways in which Merleau-Ponty's analysis opens up the deconstructive treatment of the same. Dismissing, without argument, Cathyrn Vasseleu's legitimate concern that the Levinasian critique of Merleau-Ponty (that there is an unjustified social unity of self and other) leads to the inescapable conclusion that we should encounter the other with indifference, Reynolds goes on to assert that insofar as transcendence is betrothed to immanence, the nullification of alterity raises moral problems, for there is always something about the other that escapes us. However, it is unclear here what the basis of the self-other connection might be. Reversibility is proposed, but the question remains, what grounds reversibility? Once again, the solution seems to come from a Derridean reading of Merleau-Ponty. If to perceive other people is to decipher a language, then insofar as we do understand what words arranged in propositions signify, we should be able to do the same for bodies. Ultimately, alterity seems to require appropriation, that is, not an understanding of the other as uniquely other and as expressing something unique, but rather a deconstructive opportunity to appropriate the other's body, gestures, words and to reexpress them as one's own. This seems to me to be an unfortunate notion of alterity, stifling both the other's original expressivity and comfortably reducing invention to interpretation. In fact, it appears to reinscribe our preoccupation with the history of philosophy ever more securely; but perhaps this is the most we can expect from deconstruction. From this point of view, the other who is merely "other than myself" is little more than a shadow of the self, dependent on the good will of an oscillating subject but never emerging from "his" shadow.