Merleau-Ponty and the Art of Perception

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Duane H. Davis and William S. Hamrick (eds.), Merleau-Ponty and the Art of Perception, SUNY Press, 2016, 309pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438459592.

Reviewed by Keith Whitmoyer, Pace University


At the beginning of his 1958-1959 course, La philosophie aujourd'hui, remarking on our "state of non-philosophy," Merleau-Ponty says, the

decadence of philosophy is inessential; it is that of a certain manner of philosophizing (in accordance with substance, subject-object, causality). Philosophy will find aid in poetry, art, etc., in a much closer relationship with them; it will come back to life and will thus reinterpret its own past metaphysics -- which is not past.[1]

The task of thinking, which he understood to issue a direct challenge to prevailing dogmas and ideologies, has been abandoned by the "express, official philosophy" that held sway at the time and perhaps still holds sway today.[2] This is the sense in which Merleau-Ponty understands Husserl's claim that we live in an era where rationality is in crisis: there is a crisis at the point where philosophy remains parasitic upon old, hardened metaphysical concepts and claims that it takes for granted and refuses to interrogate. In a word, philosophy enters a state of crisis when it gives up on questioning its own possibility. It is possible, however, to rise up out of this ossification "like the phoenix" if thinking takes its cue from the non-philosophies that have carried forward its responsibility in its stead.[3] Art, broadly construed in the sense of τέχνη, including the fine arts, architecture and design, comes to play a particularly important role in opening a path beyond the Cartesian metaphysics of strange, mind-infused res extensa that has haunted so much of Western thought. The overcoming of metaphysics, for Merleau-Ponty, can be staged only at the frontiers between what is ordinarily considered "philosophy" and its others.

This volume strives to take this injunction seriously by bringing together contributions that challenge the boundary between what we might consider the "inside" and "outside" of thinking. Here, the task of thinking with and through Merleau-Ponty's writings is taken up by philosophers and non-philosophers, some who have worked closely with Merleau-Ponty's texts and have specific training in the history of philosophy, and others who approach his thought from a vantage point outside of that closeness. The result is a collection that sees the his writings and what is expressed in them from the often restricted point of view of the specialist, burdened by the weight of tradition and its assumptions, as well as an intimacy and proximity that often obscures one's point of view. But the collection also examines his body of work from a multiplicity of angles and interpolates frictions and tensions alongside what otherwise may have struck the reader as "obvious."

Here we find wonderful documentation of how a site of thinking may function as a point of hermeneutic rupture, inspiration for a dehiscence, a splitting open of thought as others take up the work of exploring that "unthought . . . which is wholly [the author's] and yet opens on something else."[4] The approaches to Merleau-Ponty and the styles of writing here are as diverse as the disciplinary perspectives represented, and in this sense the volume truly succeeds in the kind of trespassing necessary for productive interdisciplinarity. I will begin by discussing the two essays that compose Part One, one by each of the co-editors. I will then turn to a survey of the remaining contributions, which compose Part Two.

The title of the volume indicates the central thesis around which the other contributions revolve: perceptual experience is aesthetic, and thus, in the same way that there is a τέχνη of painting there is also a τέχνη of perception. First, this means that what shows itself in perceptual experience, unlike some factual atom that would be unassailably true or false, is open to interpretation in a way that is analogous to works of art. To experience is to be open to a tissue of sense that gestures toward a multitude of interpretive possibilities simultaneously. and it would be strange to say of someone's experience that its meaning is false in the same way it is strange to say that one's own experience of beauty is false. Second, and perhaps more profoundly, it recalls what Duane Davis describes as the "aesthetic essence of aisthesis" and the "aisthetic essence of aesthesis" (5). To speak of the art of perception is to remind us that our experience, our αἴσθησις, is already one of value and meaning, beauty and ugliness, of open possibilities that call for articulation.

As Davis notes, Merleau-Ponty's thought is "the attempt to illustrate the possibility of experience and the experience of possibility without reducing one to the other (6)". These poles do not stand in a relationship of founding-founded but intersect and cross, like the Greek letter χ. They are chiasmatically intertwined, Ineinander, as Merleau-Ponty liked to say in reference to Husserl, each one embedded in the other. The essays collected here explore this crossing and reticulation of the perceived world and the expressivity, the ποίησις, that shows forth in the τέχνες lying on the horizon of Merleau-Ponty's thinking. It is the poetic capacity for bringing forth that is shared among perceptual experience, the philosophy that interrogates it, and the non-philosophies that assume the tasks of this interrogation. To return to the perceived world, as Davis notes, is to return to the appearance of sense beneath the articulations and abstractions of modern science. Art, what we could call the poets of visibility, recovers the value already inscribed in the world's manifestation, value that modern science, after Descartes, attempted to expunge in the name of neutral, indifferent, and value-less facts. This desire for decontamination, according to Davis, "is a contrivance of which art is innocent" (41) as artists have always recognized the world to be intrinsically burdened by value and meaning.

Nonetheless, to make accusations of irrationalism or of a Heidegger-inspired hostility to natural science on the part of Merleau-Ponty would be a grave error. We are reminded of this in the second essay by William S. Hamrick. Even a cursory glance at Merleau-Ponty's writings, such as The Structure of Behavior or Phenomenology of Perception, shows that he was sympathetically engaged with the natural sciences consistently over the course of his career. "Eye and Mind," his final publication before his death, Hamrick argues, should be understood as a continuation of this engagement, specifically of the famous courses he gave on the concept of nature from the mid to late 1950s. What we learn is that while philosophy may give up on the task of thinking when it uncritically gives itself over to the sovereignty of a certain understanding of truth and its desire to purify fact of value, the sciences themselves are at least occasionally able to think beyond the confines of fact and return thought to the poetics of visibility that so many philosophies enamored of science neglect. Alongside the τέχνη of art, the τέχνη of the sciences may also indicate a path that takes us beyond the philosophy of subjects and objects, as in the cases of those scientists who "dwell among the phenomena," as Hamrick says, like Dian Fossey, Jane Goodall, or Marie Curie (61). What we discover in Merleau-Ponty's thought thanks to this collection are the multiplicity of τέχνες that take up the task of thinking -- the arts and sciences, but others such as architecture, literature, and music -- as well as the farther zones they indicate and that are yet to be explored.

In the first three essays in Part Two, we see Merleau-Ponty's thought from the perspective of artists who have found inspiration in his writings. In "Cohesion and Expression" Jessica Wiskus, a musician and musicologist by training, explores the development of Merleau-Ponty's considerations of depth in his studies of the work of Cézanne: "Cézanne's Doubt," "Indirect Language and the Voices of Silence," and "Eye and Mind." She claims that by tracing this study, we see that every "movement of artistic labor," even painting, is characterized by a kind of rhythm: "the movement through which the non-coincident hesitations, approaches, and experiments cohere as a meaning that exceeds what is merely present (83)". "Echoes of Brushstrokes," is by the Italian-Dutch visual artist Marta Nijhuis, whose work is featured on the book's cover. Here we find a personal testimony to how the writings of a philosopher, working from a perspective outside the making and production of art, can nonetheless inspire an artist at work. Nijhuis appropriately understands Merleau-Ponty as an artist himself, and what we see when we engage his writings are the expressive relics of a ποιητής engaged in the fecund process of thought: like the artist herself as she paints, Merleau-Ponty has brought something forth in writing that is as of yet not fully articulate. Sara J. Northerner ("From Edmund Husserl's Image Consciousness to Maurice Merleau-Ponty's Flesh and Chiasm") provides a thorough account of how philosophical writings – Husserl's and Merleau-Ponty's specifically -- inform the reasoning and thought process involved in creating an artistic work, in this case an installation consisting of a series of larger than life-size portraits. Interestingly, not only do we see philosophical writings function as source material for artistic practice, but the work of art itself makes visible what was otherwise expressed in those works only in writing.

The next two contributions take up Merleau-Ponty's work from the perspective of architecture. In "Carnal Language and the Reversibility of Architecture," Bryan E. Norwood addresses the question of architectural language in the context of Merleau-Ponty's interpretation of Saussure with special emphasis on the idea of reversibility. He claims that Merleau-Ponty's theory of signs offers an alternative to the debate between modernists, who insist that architectural elements at their best signify only themselves, e.g., the window is only a window, and post-modernists, for whom the window is always more than a window because architectural language has become detached from its origin in human dwelling. Merleau-Ponty's phenomenological appropriation of Saussurean semiotics, alternatively, allows for an architectural signification in which elements are open to a multiplicity of references and at the same time grounded in a lived and concrete historical context. Patricia M. Locke ("Architecture and the Voices of Silence") develops the phenomenological significance of the built environment further through the motifs of the glance, the hand, and the body, drawing from the work of the American designer and landscape architect, Isamu Noguchi. Noguchi's designs, especially the Noguchi Garden Museum in Queens, New York, she argues, are exemplars of the manner in which architecture manifestly brings the poetics of the visible into articulation.

The next group of contributions examines the crossing of Merleau-Ponty's work with poetry and literature. "The Philosopher of Modern Life," the second contribution by Davis, provides a necessary look at the influence of Baudelaire on Merleau-Ponty's thought. Davis claims that the development of several key concepts in Merleau-Ponty's later works, réversibilité, empiètement, and écart, can be traced back to Baudelaire's influence. Insofar as these concepts figure in the critique of modernity staged in the development of Merleau-Ponty's late ontology -- a critique no less political than metaphysical -- the philosopher is able to escape the shadow of modernity only thanks to the poet. Cheryl A. Emerson ("The Flesh Made Word") turns to one of les Américains that Merleau-Ponty mentions in his La philosophie aujourd'hui lecture, William Faulkner. Among the literary works that take up the tasks of thinking are a number by American authors who are placed alongside Proust and Joyce as mirrors of the indirect manner of expression that Merleau-Ponty was seeking. Emerson provides a careful reading of Faulkner's classic work, As I Lay Dying, using Merleau-Ponty's thought as a hermeneutic lens. Her reading also sheds light on several important concepts in the latter, however, such as our immersion in a perceptual milieu, the body, the glance, and reversibility. Importantly at stake is the narrative structure Faulkner adopts, as the world that shows itself in the novel does so through a multiplicity of perspectives that cross, come into conflict, and evince the lived experience of the characters.

The final group of contributions bring Merleau-Ponty into dialogue with a number of thinkers from the history of philosophy. The first, "Listening in Depth" by Galen A. Johnson, stages such a dialogue by taking up two texts by the contemporary French philosopher Jean-Luc Nancy: Listening and Corpus. Johnson addresses the critique Nancy levels against Merleau-Ponty's concept of flesh for being monolithic and totalizing, and argues that, through Nancy's own account of listening, we can understand the flesh in terms of multiples rather than as a unity. In his second contribution, "Art and the Overcoming of the Discourse of Modernity," Hamrick, brings Merleau-Ponty into an alliance with Schelling insofar as both offer what the author designates as an "aesthetic" critique of certain modernist prejudices that debase nature by rendering it into a mechanized thing. The inspiration Merleau-Ponty finds in Schelling, accordingly, is the restoration of value to nature -- value that had been erased by the rise of Cartesian metaphysics and the Galilean revolution in modern science.

Robert Switzer ("Tactile Cogito") enters into a debate surrounding the perhaps ill-named tacit cogito, first discussed in Phenomenology of Perception and later rejected by Merleau-Ponty in a working note to The Visible and the Invisible. By bringing Merleau-Ponty into dialogue with Descartes and various representatives of the Cartesian cogito, including Kant, Husserl, and Sartre, Switzer argues that the "tacit cogito," which we should understand in accordance with a model of tactility, refers to our immersion in a context of sense, a "web of differences" (270) that precedes our conscious, thetic relationship to the world. The final contribution, "The Chiasm as a Virtual" by Marcello Vitali Rosati, brings Merleau-Ponty into dialogue with Deleuze on the question of possibility and the virtual. For Merleau-Ponty, Rosati argues, theater sheds a great deal of light on this question: the actor playing a role is not the necessary realization of a latent possibility; rather the actor is virtually the character and the character virtually the actor. These two poles cross and encroach upon one another without one ever being reducible to its opposite. In this way, he argues, Merleau-Ponty goes beyond Deleuze, who remained committed to the idea that the virtual dominates the actual.

This book is a welcome affirmation of the fluidity, versatility, and interdisciplinarity of Merleau-Ponty's thinking. The contributions are consistently excellent. In light of the combination of scholarly rigor and interdisciplinary appeal, it will be of interest to both specialists looking for careful interpretations of Merleau-Ponty's texts and to those who may be coming to these for the first time or from the borderlands of non-philosophy.

[1] Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. Notes de Cours 1959-1961. Gallimard, 1996, 39. Translation by Keith Whitmoyer.

[2] Ibid.

[3] Ibid.

[4] Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. Signes. Gallimard, 1960, 260.