Merleau-Ponty and the Paradoxes of Expression

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Donald A. Landes, Merleau-Ponty and the Paradoxes of Expression, Bloomsbury, 2013, 210pp., $44.95 US (pbk), ISBN 9781441111746.

Reviewed by Kym Maclaren, Ryerson University


Expression has typically been taken to be just one of many pivotal topics in Merleau-Ponty’s life’s work — found primarily in his writings on language and art. In a book that I expect will reorient the terrain of Merleau-Ponty scholarship, however, Donald Landes shows us that expression is rather the very heart of Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy.

Through an insightful and nuanced reading of Merleau-Ponty’s life’s work, Landes demonstrates that expression, with its “paradoxical logic,” is what enables Merleau-Ponty to take up fundamental paradoxes that have riddled philosophical efforts to think mind and body, perception, interpersonal relations, history, politics, animal life, art, language, ontology, and philosophy itself. Thinking that emerges out of the Cartesian heritage has a tendency to deal with these paradoxes in a reductive manner, “resolving” them only by denying the reality of ambiguity and paradox, drawing distinctions which distort, and thus in an important sense missing that which it aims to comprehend. Landes shows, however, that Merleau-Ponty’s logic of expression, in contrast, allows paradoxes to be embraced and profound new insight thereby realized.

Landes suggests (though he does not put it quite this way) that expression is at issue in Merleau-Ponty’s work on at least three levels. First, insight into the paradoxical character of the various realities interrogated comes through finding an expressive logic at work in each of them. But also, through thinking these different realities according to their paradoxical logic of expression, Merleau-Ponty deepens his understanding of expression itself. The logic of expression thus both elucidates and is elucidated by that which calls to be thought. Finally, then, expressive interrogation comes to be seen, by Merleau-Ponty, as philosophy’s essential task. Landes, by drawing out these dimensions of expression in Merleau-Ponty’s work, provides us with a new way of understanding the main trajectory of Merleau-Ponty’s thought.

Landes proceeds by tracing out this trajectory in its historical development, beginning with Merleau-Ponty’s first article published (“Christianity and Ressentiment”) and finishing with his posthumously published and incomplete work The Visible and the Invisible. In each chapter we are offered remarkably lucid and revealing readings of the texts (moving almost chapter by chapter through key writings), which foreground how the logic of expression is at work in them and are deeply informed by Landes’ impressive and expansive knowledge of Merleau-Ponty’s entire corpus, his keen awareness of the historical circumstances, and his familiarity with secondary literature in both France and the Anglo-American world.

The Introduction is where the groundwork for these textual readings is laid. Landes lays out the paradoxical character of expression and, by drawing upon key ideas in the work of Jean-Luc Nancy and especially Gilbert Simondon, articulates Merleau-Ponty’s account of its logic in a new and illuminating manner. It is in good part through Nancy’s notion of “exscription” and Simondon’s notions of “transductive logic” and “metastable equilibrium” that Landes lends us new insight. Since the ensuing chapters rest on this Introduction, I will devote some time to reflecting on some of its key ideas before offering summaries of those chapters.

As Landes reminds us, for Merleau-Ponty, expression is not the making public or externalization of an already possessed meaning or thought. Rather, it is only in expression that we accomplish our thoughts or find out what we meant. Paradoxically, then, the meaning that we seek to express only exists once it is expressed (13, 21). What precedes expression is, however, not nothing. It is a pregnant silence inhabiting the established order — a silence characterized by tensions that threaten to undo that order and that call for a new way of making sense. That established order is, then, merely a “metastable equilibrium” — an equilibrium that is only “precariously stable” (25) and that can give rise to new and unforeseen forms of equilibrium, new ways of crystallizing meaning or sense, through the act of expression. The new meaning expressed is, correspondingly, not a meaning fully possessed, finally circumscribed. It is rather a “sense” we cotton onto (8, 14), a kind of reconfiguration or reordering of things that includes its own pregnant silences or latent content and introduces its own internal tensions and lines of force which maintain the sense, keep the equilibrium, but only precariously. That which is expressed is thus an inscription which also “exscribes”: it brings along, but also turns us away from — that is, it makes present as absent — its own latent content or the still unthought, inarticulate, indeterminate directions of meaning that support it (9). Since “what is exscribed overflows every possible inscription and yet only exists as the excess of inscriptions,” expression is an ongoing project, an “open and endless trajectory,” and we are forever having to begin again; the full inscription of truth is “forever deferred” (18).

The process of expression thus moves by a “transductive logic”: in expression, new meaning, or a new form of sense crystallizes. Expression introduces a new configuration of sense which, though it is motivated by the previous form of crystallization and the tensions therein, does not merely reorganize preexisting terms. Rather, it realizes new terms in new relations. For example, though in linguistic expression we make use of already established words and rely upon the weight of their history of meaningful uses, genuine expression also transforms the word’s sense. The poet manages to reveal a new dimension of the world only by using words in ways that stretch them in new directions, mobilize their unnoticed powers, transforming them into new powers of expression. Paradoxically, then, “the meaning of words is shaped by their use, and yet . . . these words are used because of the meaning they will have in this new context” (11). The advent of new meaning is both enabled by, and a metamorphosis of, the weight of the past and present in relation to the future to come.

Expression is thus a matter of an ongoing interrogation of the unsaid, or the potent silences. Each word or gesture inscribed in the act of expression is itself only the trace or vestige of what is exscribed, and if we are to catch its sense, we must “gear into the metastable structures of experience” and perform the sense of their vestiges (5) — which is to say that we must continue the trajectory of expression. Landes argues on this basis that expression is — whether it is linguistic or not — a form of writing, leaving a trace to be read. And reading is the expressive taking up of that trace — a taking up that, precisely by trying to answer to the weight of that trace, by trying to say what lays unsaid in it and thus repeat it, institutes something new. Expression can thus be understood as an action “between pure repetition and creation”; or, more fundamentally, it can be understood as the performance of gestures that “create and sustain structures that paradoxically transcend them and solicit them” (4). This is what Landes aims to show by following the trajectory of Merleau-Ponty’s work and reading the traces established therein.

Chapter One proposes that, from his earliest work, Merleau-Ponty is animated by the antinomies of body and soul, subject and object, first and third person, and by his disappointment in the ways in which these are taken up by the Cartesian tradition (especially Brunschvicg’s “Kantian fulfilment” (47) of it). Landes claims that Merleau-Ponty discovers another, more productive way of responding to these antinomies through his engagements with Scheler and Marcel; these engagements set him on the path of a phenomenology that aims not at eidetic description of perception but at the description of the paradoxical nature of lived experience (42). In “Christianity and Ressentiment” Merleau-Ponty unfolds Scheler’s notion of ressentiment: ressentiment motivates a turn away from, and reduction of, what presents us with an enigma. The Cartesian tradition is characterized by ressentiment, and the new task is to think these enigmas in non-reductive ways. Scheler’s notion of intentionality and expressivity and Marcel’s notions of mystery, one’s own body, and creativity offer resources for this.

Chapter Two argues that, in the Structure of Behavior, Merleau-Ponty pursues the antinomy of subject and object by addressing two ways of understanding nature that emerge out of the Cartesian tradition: according to mechanistic causality or according to transcendental thought. Working from an outside perspective as the scientist does, Merleau-Ponty aims to think animal behavior, which is paradoxically neither a thing (as causal thinkers would have it) nor an idea (as transcendental philosophy would have it) but expression. Behavior develops in the relation between animal and its environment: the animal responds to a solicitation from the environment in a way that, while informed by its bodily resources and its past, establishes a new perceptual significance within the environment and improvises a new organization of its own body or movement. Behavior is thus not something reducible to mind or matter, but has “its own meaningful unity and reality” (76).

Chapter Three turns to the Phenomenology of Perception. Landes make the case that there is one trajectory being worked out through the diverse analyses undertaken in this text — namely, revealing the expressive nature of our embodied being in the world, but this time from within experience. Challenging the notion of a transcendental subject, Merleau-Ponty makes a case, in various ways, for our embodiment and perception — indeed, even for our “cogito” — being an expressive response to and taking up of already established meanings that transcend us.

Chapter Four considers Merleau-Ponty’s political writings and argues that he is proposing a politics of expression. Merleau-Ponty’s Adventures of the Dialectic is sometimes understood as a rejection of his earlier Humanism and Terror, substituting parliamentary liberalism for Marxism. Landes, however, argues convincingly that it is not a rejection but a reworking. What Marxism gets right are the paradoxically expressive structures of action and history: it sees that our actions inevitably involve an encroachment upon, and violence to, others, so that the meaning of our action is always in excess of what we intend, and yet we are responsible for it. Marxism needs to be reworked, however, insofar as it supposes that this movement of history comes to an end, and its ambiguity is overcome. Instead, what is called for is an intensification of questioning that acknowledges this expressive logic and continues the expressive dialectic in a mode of ethical responsibility, aiming for the least violence.

In Chapter Five, Landes explores texts on art, language, and expression where, Landes claims, Merleau-Ponty more thoroughly establishes the logic of expression as one of transduction, and thus as involving the on-going institution of “metastable structures” and “a trajectory of performances of sense” (135). The thing painted, for instance, is itself an “inexhaustible reality full of reserves” (129) so that no painter exhausts or fully possesses its sense. Insofar as Cézanne’s work manages to express this inexhaustibility or ongoing trajectory, it suggests for philosophy, too, a new way of approaching the phenomena that remains open to the paradoxical logic of expression (128).

Chapter Six claims that, in his last writings (“Eye and Mind” and The Visible and the Invisible), Merleau-Ponty is exploring the ontological significance of the paradoxical logic of expression. This leads both to Merleau-Ponty’s ontology of the flesh and reversibility and to an understanding of philosophical interrogation as expression. Reversibility is expressive: “this fundamental structure is what places us within the metastable systems [within Being] that our gestures bring about and sustain, but that nevertheless transcend us” (175). Philosophical interrogation, correspondingly, “aims to gear into the open and metastable structures of Being without thereby making a claim to reveal Being itself, that is, according to its ability to always express so as to solicit more expression” (162).

The Epilogue reflects briefly on the implications of our new understanding of the paradoxical logic of expression for reading the unpublished lectures, which Landes doesn’t discuss in this book.

Landes ultimately provides us with a compelling, well-developed argument for understanding Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy in terms of his effort to think along with the expressive logic at work in our being in the world and in being itself, as it continuously and never fully reveals itself. The nature of the project requires that Landes move quickly through the many texts he elucidates, but this does not mean that his work is superficial. Far from it. He is able to mirror in his deeds what he argues for in words: he is able to avoid being reductive and to offer lucid and profound insights while maintaining the sense of the depth of Merleau-Ponty’s thought and the sense that there is more to be thought within it and through it. Landes thus not only offers a compelling thesis about Merleau-Ponty’s work but also a productive framing of that work for future Merleau-Ponty scholarship.

If there is a weakness in the book, I would locate it in its attempt to communicate the movement or development in Merleau-Ponty’s understanding of expression. Certainly, Landes shows us how the domains in which Merleau-Ponty finds an expressive logic at work become increasingly ontological. But, as I read him, Landes also aims to trace the ways in which Merleau-Ponty’s understanding of expression undergoes its own expressive transformations, so that aspects of expression that are realized only in his later works are there in the early works in merely nascent, potently silent, “exscribed” ways. This is an inherently difficult task: how does one call attention to nascent possibilities without making them no longer nascent? One way in which Landes attempts to deal with this, it seems, is by characterizing the development as progressing from expression conceived as “an act between pure repetition and pure creation” (e.g. 56, 60, 67) to an expressive logic “of taking up from within that which the act sustains and yet that which transcends any given act” (e.g. 174). One might wonder whether the former characterization does justice to expression as it shows up in the earlier texts. But my proposed criticism here is that, despite that general characterization, Landes employs for his detailed description of the early texts concepts or logics that he also seems to argue really only come to be established in the later texts — notions like “metastable trajectory,” “exscription,” “transductive logic,” and “bringing about and sustaining structures that nonetheless transcend” each expression (e.g. 56). This might be Landes showing us what Merleau-Ponty had not yet fully articulated for himself. But it is not clearly marked out as such. As a result, though Landes is trying to trace a development and indeed gives us many other excellent resources for thinking this development, one can get drawn, contrary to Landes’ intentions, into the sense that we are seeing merely the same logic of expression being applied, by Merleau-Ponty, over and over again to different issues. It can be difficult to witness the development unless one reads with an eye to this issue.

Notwithstanding, Landes’ book provides, as I hope I have communicated, a lucid, insightful, and ultimately revolutionary contribution to the study of Merleau-Ponty’s work. With its clarity, comprehensiveness, and scholarly expertise, it provides an important and helpful resource for students of Merleau-Ponty. But impressively it also goes far beyond its pedagogical virtues by establishing a penetrating and compelling new way of reading Merleau-Ponty — a reading that should, I think, transform Merleau-Ponty scholarship.