Merleau-Ponty between Philosophy and Symbolism: The Matrixed Ontology

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Rajiv Kaushik, Merleau-Ponty between Philosophy and Symbolism: The Matrixed Ontology, SUNY Press, 2019, 171pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438476766.

Reviewed by Laura McMahon, Eastern Michigan University


Phenomenology, in Lisa Guenther's succinct definition, "begins with a description of lived experience and reflects on the structures that make this experience possible and meaningful." Guenther's definition is illuminating for a number of reasons. First, it highlights the fact that phenomenology as a philosophical methodology always begins with -- and is always ultimately beholden to -- familiar, concrete, and recognizable phenomena of experience as it is actually lived. Second, it draws our attention to the manner in which lived experience is by no means simply transparent to itself, but is rather reliant upon structures that may precisely withdraw from thematization within lived experience. For example, lived experience can only take the forms that it does thanks to the development and sedimentation of bodily habits that reveal the world to us in specific, developed ways, yet the work of habituation typically recedes from notice: it is repressed in the very expressions it makes possible. As Rajiv Kaushik writes in his latest book:

When I write, suddenly my hand and arm become less important and secondary to what the inscribed words say, and thus they are repressed. When I discuss a matter with someone, the tacit situation on the basis of which we can talk is likewise non-obvious and repressed. (p. 97)

Third, Guenther's definition of phenomenology allows us to see the manner in which phenomenology is a transcendental philosophy, in that it seeks to elucidate the conditions of possibility for experience to take the coherent forms it does, and a critical project, in that it limits itself to elucidating what shows itself (even by hiding itself) within the bounds of experience as it is actually lived.

Kaushik's book demonstrates how Merleau-Ponty's phenomenological philosophy approaches the deepest levels of the transcendental field that makes lived experience possible. Focusing predominantly on Merleau-Ponty's late ontology in The Visible and the Invisible (posthumously published in 1964) and a number of his lecture notes (especially those from the 1954-1955 courses Institution and Passivity), Kaushik argues that the transcendental field with which Merleau-Ponty is ultimately concerned cannot be articulated in terms of the intentional structure of consciousness, but rather in terms of symbolic matrices that work as the limits both of what meaningfully appears and what does not appear, of what is expressed and what repressed, of the visible and the invisible. The symbolic matrix is the ontological tissue from which difference opens, but which or its part remains unexhibitable and undisclosable; it is an ontological disruption or divergence that never appears as such, but only in and through the mutations it makes possible. In an allusion to Cassirer's Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, Merleau-Ponty writes: "Consider criticism itself as a symbolic form and not a philosophy of symbolic forms" (Institution and Passivity, quoted p. xviii). Taking this note as a central inspiration, Kaushik argues that philosophical criticism cannot ultimately clarify the symbolic matrix from which it emerges, but is rather its own peculiar kind of expression (and repression) of this symbolic matrix. Since the sense of the symbolic matrix is not simply exhausted in the meanings it makes possible, Kaushik argues that phenomenology as it is developed by Merleau-Ponty is not guilty, as some critics charge, of reorienting incoherency to coherency, inconsistency to consistency, nonsense to sense; rather, a phenomenology that does not limit itself to describing the structures of intentional life can be alive to what philosophers have recently called the "event" -- a rupture with the normal and familiar.

Chapter 1, "Matrix Events: Methods and Antecedents," presents a non-exhaustive history of diacritical methods in philosophy in order to demonstrate what is unique about Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of disruption or divergence. In dialogue with the diphthong in Homeric poetry, with Plato's method of dividing-collecting in The Sophist, and with Heraclitus's fragment on the unity of opposites, Kaushik argues that Merleau-Ponty's concept of ├ęcart in The Visible and the Invisible constitutes a diacritical conception of separation, or the originating of differences in the sensible world. Kaushik elaborates the meaning of this understanding of ├ęcart through attention to a number of divergences characteristic of our experience of the sensible world, all of which constitute a certain impoverishment of the polymorphic matrix that is at their heart and that twists, meanders, and zigzags through them. First, Kaushik discusses the emergence of monocular vision -- the referent of perception as we normally experience it -- from binocular vision, or the thing perceived by two eyes, that is, from multiple vantage points. This latter kind of vision, which has incommensurability and incoherence right within it, is repressed by its monocular products, which are stable and coherent yet phantasmatic and unreal. Second, Kaushik draws our attention to the manner in which the seeing of universal contours, geometrical forms, or essences is a divergence from the dense, poly-perspectival character of things as they are given in the sensible world; essences and facts are not an ontological categorial distinction, but an emergent difference immanent to the sensible field itself. Third, Kaushik identifies the "dehiscence" of the body -- its splitting or bursting open -- as both sensible and sensing as the production of differences, and as the internal delimitation on the part of the sensible field itself.

Chapter 2, "Space -- Imagination," carries on the discussion of the debt that geometrical forms owe to the sensible world, through a discussion of space and imagination in Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. As Husserl poses the question, how do the plane-beings of math and science obscure their roots in the infinitely richer lifeworld from which they? Kaushik argues that Merleau-Ponty's philosophy helps us to understand the imagination as central to the production of space and the spatial opening up of the differences between things and between subject and object. Painting and sculpture are two artistic media that help us recognize this point. The figure of the hand pointing in Rembrandt's The Nightwatch only appears thanks to the play of depth and shadow that enables the figure to show itself from the plenum of the visible. The abstract paintings of Matisse or Klee enable us to see the work performed by the imagination in the perception of stable forms: in Kaushik's words, abstraction "is not free in the sense that it has nothing to do with figures and forms. It is free in the sense that it has been liberated from the substructed geometrical ideas so that we may now see two incompossible lines without the need for their coherence or togetherness" (pp. 46-47). And a sculpture such as Henry Moore's Double Standing Figure "creates two bulks by showing how and in what manner each is exposed at its limits in order to be what they are" (p. 47). As the notes of a piece of music are able to be heard as a meaningful, expressive order rather than an indecipherable chaos of sensations thanks to the silence that separates these sounds and precedes and follows the performance of the piece, so the imagination opens up the space of the meaningful figures of the sensible, preventing them from collapsing into one singular plenum. However, these forms are by no means essential, but only certain possible ways of giving form to the sensible. Because there is no ultimate perspective from which to do away with the fecund depth or the silence from which meaningful figures emerge (since any change in position only works to generate other depths), "every figure is always capable of being otherwise than it now appears" (p. 50).

In Chapter 3, "Light -- Dark/Awake -- Asleep," Kaushik deepens his account of the central place of the imagination in Merleau-Ponty's ontology by arguing that imagination emerges not primarily from the intentional life of a subject, but from a more originary anonymity. Kaushik finds this anonymity at play in three themes in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy. First, there is a non-illuminable source of the illumination necessary for the appearance of things. Drawing on Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception alongside Jean-Luc Nancy's studies of light, Kaushik argues that illumination is possible thanks to a source that must itself remain in darkness. He writes: "Rather than a source, light is an endless refraction and flash-like. This refraction never shows. Its primary character is diversion. Yet both the phenomenon as well as its disclosure are because of the very texture of this already diverted light" (pp. 64-65). Second, Kaushik links the anonymity inherent in the ontological work of imagination to Merleau-Ponty's conception of the elemental in The Visible and the Invisible. Elementality as such resists the sensible, and yet only shows itself through its appearance in figures and things: "There is no color in itself, for example, but only specific colors" (p. 57). Third, Kaushik links the anonymity at the heart of imaginative and perceptual life to Merleau-Ponty's understanding of sleep in Institution and Passivity. In further dialogue with Heraclitus and Heidegger, Kaushik explores Merleau-Ponty's claim that sleep is being in the divergence -- the divergence between light and dark, sense and non-sense, the visible and the invisible. Contrasting waking and dreaming as forms of intentional life, on the one hand, and dreamless sleep as the opposite of consciousness and non-intentional, on the other hand, Kaushik suggests that to sleep is to fall into the light source itself, that is, into the darkness of the symbolic matrix at the secret heart of the life of consciousness and the appearance of things in the sensible world.

Chapter 4, "Philosophy -- Symbolism," continues the analysis of Merleau-Ponty's lectures on sleep, here focusing on the world of dreams and dreamy ephemera that contains our sleep. Kaushik is particularly concerned in this discussion with Merleau-Ponty's interpretation of Freud's unconventional thought concerning the nature of oneiric symbolization in The Interpretation of Dreams. In Kaushik's analysis, oneiric symbols are both positive and a censor, opening up the difference between the exterior, public space of the world and the interior, private space of consciousness, between expression and repression, between being and non-being, and between manifest and latent content. In Merleau-Ponty's interpretation of Freud, the latent content of the dream is only ever accessible through the manifest content in which it shows itself by concealing itself, and it is only their shared divergence from a basic symbolic form -- which itself resists signification -- that makes these divergences possible. To seek to articulate the limits of this philosophical production and censorship amounts, Kaushik argues, "to a sort of psychoanalysis . . . of philosophy" (p. 100). The linguistic work of analysis -- whose proper method is that of hermeneutic reverie -- has a special role to play not merely in the revelation of latent meanings that are simply waiting there to be discovered, but in the very production of these meanings. As literary language like that of Stendhal helps us to see, subjectivity is constituted in the act of writing and cannot be discovered otherwise.

Indeed, in Chapter 5, "Philosophical Language -- Literary Language," Kaushik argues that eloquent or literary language is "nothing less than symbolism or oneirism itself" (p. 110). Merleau-Ponty writes in his 1952 essay "Indirect Language and the Voices of Silence" that what is irreplaceable in the work of art is "The fact that it contains, better than ideas, matrices of ideas -- the fact that it provides us with symbols whose meaning we never stop developing" (quoted p. 110). Drawing on the work of Marcel Proust and on his discussions of Proust in his lecture courses Institution and Passivity, Kaushik argues that there is a certain autonomy of language apart from the intentions of the author and the interests of the reader, for the text's continuity over time "rests on a language which, for the author, always fails to express and, for the reader, can always be reinvigorated" (p. 117). However, this power of fecund continuity is not only reserved for works of art: philosophical works, such as Merleau-Ponty's own Visible and the Invisible, possess a non-conceptual, ontogenetic power that originates, but cannot fully be expressed in, the conceptual language of philosophy. Once again, we see the logic of an unarticulated symbolic matrix that exists as, but is never exhausted by, its articulation in specific figures or concepts, but this time in the form of the non-conceptual or the non-philosophical upon which the conceptual or the philosophical is always premised. Language can never master the symbolic matrix that makes it possible, but a phenomenology of language, art, and dreams is "an invitation for lucidity to . . . catch a glimpse of its symbolic formation which still remains unsedimented" (p. xxviii), or to glimpse the savage limits of language itself. Since these savage, ontogenetic limits can never be brought into full lucidity or articulation, Kaushik argues, citing a Working Note of The Visible and the Invisible, "the impossibility of reducing language . . . is its reduction" (p. 103).

Kaushik's book is a sophisticated engagement with Merleau-Ponty's late thought. It situates Merleau-Ponty's phenomenological ontology in the domain of deconstruction and "philosophies of the event," and it joins company with other recent scholarship devoted to bringing out the import of themes of institution and passivity in Merleau-Ponty's ontology, including Alia Al-Saji, Don Beith, Don Landes, Kym Maclaren, Scott Marratto, Glen Mazis, David Morris, John Russon, Emmanuel Saint-Aubert, Keith Whitmoyer, and the authors of the essays in the collection Time, Memory, Institution: Merleau-Ponty's New Ontology of Self. It is a complex and difficult book that relies on extensive background knowledge of phenomenology, Merleau-Ponty, and other figures in Continental Philosophy and the history of philosophy on the part of its readers, and will thus be of primary interest to Merleau-Ponty specialists.

A couple of words of criticism follow from this last observation. With some notable exceptions, such as his discussion of artworks and literary texts in Chapters Two and Five, Kaushik offers relatively few concrete examples to illustrate the phenomena of which he writes and to provide evidence from lived experience of the theses that he advances. On the one hand, this authorial decision is in keeping with his argument that Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology ultimately requires us to go beyond the description of the intentionality of lived experience to the symbolic matrices -- the dark source of illumination, the elemental, the oneiric space of divergence, the ontogenetic power of literary language -- that never appear as such within lived experience, and which thus in principle resist any concrete exemplification in the familiar terms of intentional existence. On the other hand, if we believe -- following Guenther's definition but going back to Husserl's "principle of all principles" -- that phenomenology must always ultimately be accountable to, and hence illuminating and enriching of, experience as it is actually lived, then a number of Kaushik's discussions might leave a reader feeling at times phenomenologically adrift. I found this especially to be the case in what are in other respects some of the most intriguing discussions of the book, namely those on sleep, dreams, and psychoanalysis. With the exception of a vivid description of falling asleep -- taken, tellingly, from Phenomenology of Perception, whose phenomenological descriptions are much more developed than those of Merleau-Ponty's posthumously published manuscripts and lecture notes -- it is sometimes hard to connect Kaushik's analyses to anything we ordinarily understand by "dreams" or "psychoanalysis." Indeed, something similar could be said about the "symbolism" in the book's title: I am left unclear -- but wanting to know more -- about what precisely this concept means for Merleau-Ponty, how this meaning contrasts with Cassirer's studies of the symbolic formation of cultural meanings, and how this meaning relates to what we might ordinarily mean by symbols in the context of artistic expression or of dreams. These reservations noted, Kaushik's book offers us a way of interpreting Merleau-Ponty that pushes us beyond the settled familiarity of much of our experience of the world to the strange, elusive, and savage roots of this experience -- strange, elusive, and savage roots that we catch glimpses of in art, dreams, psychoanalysis, and phenomenology itself, and that allow for other possibilities of seeing, imagining, and understanding.


Guenther, Lisa. 2014. "The Concrete Abyss," Aeon, 16 April 2014. Accessed 4 June 2020.

Morris, David and Kym Maclaren (eds.). 2015. Time, Memory, Institution: Merleau-Ponty's New Ontology of Self, Ohio University Press.