Merleau-Ponty: Key Concepts

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Rosalyn Diprose and Jack Reynolds (eds.), Merleau-Ponty: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2008, 255pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651160.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


The editors have compiled a useful collection of introductory essays on Merleau-Ponty. The volume would serve well as an accompanying textbook in philosophy courses or as a guide for scholars unfamiliar with Merleau-Ponty wishing a brief, clear, and comprehensive introduction to his work. For readers with some familiarity with Merleau-Ponty, however, the essays, while they do provide ample food for thought, do not by and large fully explore the many complex issues they address. This reticence is a function of the design of the book as an introductory text, and the limitation on the size of the essays. With nineteen substantive essays taking up some 220 pages, each essay is limited to approximately eleven pages. The choices of level and essay size are certainly valid editorial decisions, but it also means that the interest of the book for established readers of Merleau-Ponty will largely be on judging its suitability as a course text, though its ability to provoke reflections that might lead to continued research should not be underplayed. We should not, however, see these essays as themselves full-fledged research pieces.

It might be useful in this regard to compare this book with the Cambridge Companion to Merleau-Ponty, which contains thirteen essays taking up some 360 pages, or twenty-eight pages each so each essay allows for more in-depth analysis. The result is that while the Acumen book is limited to an introductory audience, the Cambridge book provides for more sustained and more developed intellectual work for those already familiar with Merleau-Ponty. Again, this is not to fault the Acumen volume, but simply to indicate its position in the field. We might also remark that one of the editors of the Acumen volume reviewed the Cambridge volume in NDPR (, remarking on the somewhat "analytic" tilt of many of the Cambridge essays. The Acumen volume doesn't label itself as a "continental" approach to Merleau-Ponty, but there is room for a good bit of metaphilosophical and/or sociological reflection on the institutionalization of contemporary philosophy in pursuing this line of thought. This review, however, is not the appropriate venue for such an undertaking.

The volume is divided into four parts: an Introduction which gives a brief account of Merleau-Ponty's life and works and a brief overview of the volume, a section on "Interventions" which places Merleau-Ponty's work in relation to the major fields of intellectual inquiry with which he engaged, a section on "Inventions" which details Merleau-Ponty's conceptual innovations, and a final section on "Extensions" dealing with the way Merleau-Ponty's work has been taken up in contemporary fields of research.

The first chapter of the Introduction, by Jack Reynolds, guides readers through the details of Merleau-Ponty's life and works, while the second, by Rosalyn Diprose, provides an overview of the essays. Diprose stresses the open-ended nature of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, and thus in a way licenses the sort of explorations of "roads not taken" that I will pursue in this review. Other readers will no doubt be sparked to other reflections. Let us begin with the "Interventions" section. These essays detail Merleau-Ponty's relation to phenomenology, existentialism, empiricism and intellectualism, psychoanalysis, philosophy of history, politics, and aesthetics. All the essays are clear and concise, offering an entry into Merleau-Ponty's thought by way of contrast with other fields. Actually, "contrast" is not exactly the right word, for Merleau-Ponty incorporates and transforms these fields as much as he distinguishes himself from them. In particular, this is true of the first two fields, phenomenology and existentialism. In the first essay, Ted Toadvine first details Merleau-Ponty's contribution to phenomenology, focusing on the methodological reflections in the Preface to Phenomenology of Perception. Toadvine upholds a continuity thesis with regard to the later reflections on method in The Visible and the Invisible. That is, he downplays Merleau-Ponty's own sense of having broken with phenomenology. Here is an example of the sort of mildly frustrating thing I mentioned above: the indication of a complex issue, but not the full exploration of it.

In the "Inventions" section we find essays on the concepts around which Merleau-Ponty's work turns: the lived body, perception, ambiguity, intersubjectivity, expression, affect, nature and animality, and chiasm and flesh. David Morris in the chapter on "body" indicates a potentially very interesting path beyond the clear and careful introduction to which he limits himself. Morris discusses how the corporeal habits of human beings open up a world of things that "transcend mere biology" (118). This is certainly true for the sort of mechanistic biology Merleau-Ponty was confronting. But contemporary theoretical biology of the "enactive" school points to "sense-making" as biological (for a résumé of the enactive school, see Thompson 2007). For instance, the chemotaxis of E. coli allows for a three-fold sense-making to be attributed to them: sensibility as openness to their enacted world; signification as the setting of positive or negative value for the organism; and "sense" as the direction of action of the organism (this last notion is lost in English, but retained for instance in the French sens unique for "one-way street"). We thus see lived bodies all the way down, as it were, below the human. These considerations lead Thompson to replace the defunct "mind-body problem" with a "body-body problem." Now this problem, which pits the lived body against the living body, is not equivalent to the Husserlian distinction between Leib vs Körper, since the latter is the merely physical body. Thus Thompson's body-body problem is not the confrontation of the lived body and the physical body, but the confrontation of the lived body and the living body, or the confrontation of first-person experience and third-person biology. We should recall, however, that for Thompson, following Varela and the theory of autopoiesis / autonomous systems, third-person biology indicates that self-hood, or at least interiority and sense-making, go all the way down to single celled organisms. So there's a tenuous sort of "first-person perspective" in all living bodies, not just the human. Here a connection with the work of Hans Jonas is also indicated (Jonas 2001). It is true that in Scott Churchill's chapter on "Nature and Animality" Merleau-Ponty's reading of the closely connected notion of Umwelt developed by von Uexküll is taken up, but the connections between the lived body of humans and biological sense-making is left unexplored. Again, this is not to fault the work of Morris, who clearly and carefully develops the basic notions at work in Merleau-Ponty, but simply to indicate what might have been developed in a work with different editorial aims

With regard to the "Extensions" section -- which deals with the taking up of Merleau-Ponty's work in contemporary feminism and race theory, cognitive science, "health studies," and sociology -- two remarks come to mind. First, an encounter with the "post-phenomenology" and "post-structuralism" of the French philosophy succeeding Merleau-Ponty would yield great dividends. There is some discussion of Levinas in Michael Sanders's chapter on intersubjectivity, but not much on Derrida's discussion of Merleau-Ponty in On Touching -- Jean-Luc Nancy (Derrida 2005). Similarly, nothing on Deleuze, despite Foucault's famous statement in his "Theatrum Philosophicum" (a review of Deleuze's Difference and Repetition and Logic of Sense) that "Logic of Sense can be read as the most alien book imaginable from Phenomenology of Perception" (Foucault 1977: 170). This claim is interrogated with characteristic skill in Leonard Lawlor's essay "The End of Phenomenology: Expressionism in Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze" (Lawlor 2003). Both the Derrida and the Deleuze connections would have been the occasion for an examination of Merleau-Ponty's relation to the "philosophy of difference" of contemporary French thought. This could have highlighted the differences between the early Merleau-Ponty and these thinkers, but also would have been the occasion for a more detailed treatment of The Visible and the Invisible, which is addressed in depth only in one essay, Fred Evans' excellent chapter on "Chiasm and Flesh."

Second, Ann Murphy's work on Merleau-Ponty's position in contemporary feminism and race theory is excellent, as is Shaun Gallagher's work on cognitive science. But it would have been very interesting to combine them. To what extent does Iris Marion Young's important essay "Throwing Like A Girl," ably treated in outline by Murphy, indicate the chance for an intervention into cognitive science? The embodied / enactive schools have made a great step in insisting upon the biological reality of cognition, but it is at least arguable that they stay with an abstract subject, untouched by gender or race. Works in the "embodied mind" or "enactive" schools (Varela, Thompson, and Rosch 1991; Clark 1997; Noë 2004; Thompson 2007) often call on Merleau-Ponty in claiming the lived body as an active subject whose practical abilities allow objects to appear as correlates of that subjectivity's possible actions. But Young shows that the assured competence of the presumably neutral or non-gendered body subject hides a masculinist presupposition. We are thus forced to consider the philosophical necessity of investigating multiple forms of embodiment.

With these moves we can bring population thinking to bear in cognitive science, thinking the distribution of cognitive capacities ("traits") in populations. In a sense, we've been stuck with old-fashioned typological thinking, talking about "the" cognitive subject, just like we used to talk about "the" lion. Of course this means we have to take seriously the social context of development, and that means taking seriously the challenge of Developmental Systems Theory (DST) (Oyama 2000; Oyama, Griffiths and Gray 2001). For DST, cognitive traits are not genetically determined; genes are a developmental resource, but there are other resources, intra-organismic and social, that need to be taken into account. And once we're in the social realm, the cat is out of the bag. There can no longer be an abstract subject, but populations of subjects, with varying distributions of capacities. And the practices that produce these capacities can be analyzed with political categories such as those Young suggests.

To conclude, then, the Acumen volume is a fine introductory work, and since Merleau-Ponty's thought is so rich, and so important to so many contemporary fields, the experienced reader will be provoked by the many connections that virtually inhabit the essays. With that in mind, we can congratulate the authors and editors of this book for ably fulfilling the introductory goals they have set for themselves, and for guiding us to imagine other work. A fine testimony, therefore, to the way Merleau-Ponty conceived of philosophy as both creative and unfinished.


Clark, Andy. 1997. Being There: Putting Brain, Body and World Together Again. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Derrida, Jacques. 2005. On Touching -- Jean-Luc Nancy. Stanford: Stanford University Press.

Foucault, Michel. 1977. Language, Counter-Memory, Practice: Selected Essays and Interviews. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Jonas, Hans. 2001. The Phenomenon of Life: Towards a Philosophical Biology. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.

Lawlor, Leonard. 2003. Thinking Through French Philosophy: The Being of the Question. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

Noë, Alva. 2004. Action in Perception. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Oyama, Susan. 2000 [1985]. The Ontogeny of Information: Developmental Systems and Evolution. 2nd ed. Durham: Duke University Press.

Oyama, Susan, Paul Griffiths, and Russell Gray, eds. 2001. Cycles of Contingency: Developmental Systems and Evolution. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Thompson, Evan. 2007. Mind in Life: Biology, Phenomenology, and the Sciences of Mind. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Varela, Francisco, Evan Thompson and Elizabeth Rosch. 1991. The Embodied Mind. Cambridge: MIT Press.