Placeholder book cover

Taylor Carman, Merleau-Ponty, Routledge, 2008, 261pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415339810.

Reviewed by Sara Heinämaa, University of Helsinki


Taylor Carman's book on Merleau-Ponty is ambitious. It aims at covering Merleau-Ponty's philosophical works, from the early study The Structure of Behavior (1942) to the latest unfinished manuscript The Visible and the Invisible (1964), and explicating the main arguments and results, from the analysis of perception to discussions on language, arts, and politics.

For some decades Merleau-Ponty was a marginal figure in Anglophone philosophy which was dominated by post-analytical, post-pragmatistic, and post-structuralistic currents of thought, but today his philosophy is embraced from all sides. Carman's work belongs to the Dreyfusian school which combines Heideggerian phenomenology with American pragmatism and 20th century analytical philosophy of mind. The book may serve as a useful introduction to students who want to get a grip of the main topics and sections of Merleau-Ponty's works, but it suffers from a tendentious reading of the sources and gives a superficial picture of Merleau-Ponty's innovative inquiries into experience. More thorough and careful argumentation for the interpretative choices and the systematic views would have added to the scholarly value of the presentation.

The main problem is that Carman not only diminishes and belittles Merleau-Ponty's continuous interchange with Husserlian sources, an interchange which began in Phenomenology and continued until The Visible, but that he also states that Merleau-Ponty's relation to Husserl's classical phenomenology is oppositional and "antithetical" (e.g., 35, 37, 42-43). This is not just a problem of exegesis but more fundamentally a problem in the understanding of philosophy, its tasks and the types of results that it can offer.

Carman claims, in a Wittgensteinian tone, that philosophical problems are "mysteries" for Merleau-Ponty (e.g., 6-7, 11, 26, 146-149). The claim implies the idea that philosophical problems cannot be solved in the same way as theoretical or practical problems can be solved, and this implication certainly belongs to Merleau-Ponty's view of philosophy. But mysteries, that is, problems that escape both speech and vision, are not the only type of non-theoretical and non-practical problems. Merleau-Ponty took seriously Husserl's argument that there is a third category: problems which concern meaning constitution and which require that we radicalize our methods of critical inquiry. These problems cannot be handled by any positive sciences -- mathematical, psychological, or logical-linguistic -- nor by life-practices. Still they do not remain mysterious but can be solved by inquiring into the multitude of experiencing and by radically questioning assumptions about being, feeling, and willing.

Carman argues that Merleau-Ponty's frequent and detailed references to Husserl's mature and late works -- the second volume of Ideas (Ideas II), The Crisis, Formal and Transcendental Logic, and Experience and Judgment -- are just manifestations of Merleau-Ponty's "generous" attitude toward past thinkers (37-39). Further, he suggests that Merleau-Ponty is equally generous to all the philosophers that he studies: Descartes, Leibniz, Spinoza, Kant, Hegel, and also Heidegger, Husserl's main critic. In such a framing, Merleau-Ponty's reformulation of phenomenology becomes a curious attempt to balance between two demands of courtesy: to Husserl's egocentric philosophy of consciousness and immanence, on the one hand, and to Heidegger's existential perspectivism, on the other hand. Carman argues:

for Merleau-Ponty, perception is not an inner subjective phenomenon, but a mode of existence, a manifestation of our being in the world. Merleau-Ponty embraced this Heideggerian theme wholeheartedly; but then projected it retrospectively back onto Husserl's phenomenology (42).

But this clearly is a mistake as we may notice at the very beginning of Phenomenology where Merleau-Ponty explains: "the whole of Sein und Zeit springs from an indication given by Husserl and amounts to no more than an explicit account of the 'natürlicher Weltbegriff' or the 'Lebenswelt' which Husserl, towards the end of his life, identified as the central theme of phenomenology" (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995: viii).

Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology is not a collection of gestures of generosity or courtesy but a rigorous attempt to rethink the foundations of perception and the perceptual world. Husserl's late works gave him an excellent starting point, not by putting forward any form of immanentism or solipsism, but by describing and analyzing intentionality as a multiform opening onto the life-world.

Carman neglects the most important motive that connects Husserl's and Heidegger's philosophies: the new post-Kantian understanding of the tasks of transcendental philosophy. This neglect leads him to divide phenomenology along the traditional lines of doctrinal philosophy: at one end we have Husserl's "rationalism", "intellectualism", and "cognitivism", and at the opposite end we have Heidegger's mysticism, factualism, and pragmatism. But what Merleau-Ponty saw, perhaps more clearly than anyone else in his time (up to the present), was the radical aims of both philosophers. He took as his task to continue their work by digging into the sediments of experience and by inquiring into the first institutions and grounds of human perception, a task that was outlined by Husserl but was left unfinished (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995: 61-63, 361-365, 425-426).

This means that Merleau-Ponty did not abandon Husserl's idea of philosophy as radical critique but, on the contrary, executed this idea in his own practice of thinking. He abandoned Kant's critical project which aimed at identifying mere conditions of possibility without recognizing genetic problems of temporal and historical constitution. He was not satisfied with any form of philosophical mysticism or quietistism, but argued explicitly that the constitutional problems of meaning can be solved if classical phenomenology is radicalized so that it questions its own limits and conditions of actuality: "A philosophy becomes transcendental, or radical, not by taking its place in absolute consciousness without mentioning the ways by which this is reached, but by considering itself as a problem" (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995: 63, cf. 219). This radicalization, Merleau-Ponty believed, can be accomplished if phenomenology engages in a dialogue with empirical sciences of life. The aim is not to fuse the two lines of inquiry or to establish a new hybrid discipline, as Carman suggests (9), but to fight against habits of idealization by exposing philosophical reflection to empirical inquiries into animal life: sensibility, sickness, sexuality, and unconsciousness.

Carman argues that Merleau-Ponty "rejected" Husserl's "semantic paradigm" and developed an ontology of the world (18, 27-28, 35ff., 74). This claim about opposition is grounded on a controversial reading of Husserl's philosophy, i.e., on the so-called Fregean reading, which was originally proposed by Dagfinn Føllesdal and developed and defended by his students (Dreyfus among them).[1] In this reading, Husserl is presented as an intellectualistic or cognitivistic philosopher who models all constituted sense and meaning on the paradigm of linguistic meaning, its propositional forms and its conceptual structures. Thus Husserl is presented as a follower of Frege, and Husserl's sophisticated analyses on intentionality and its different forms are boiled down to the simple opposition between content (Fregean sense) and object (Fregean reference) (16).

Carman's exegetic decision has several problematic consequences for the interpretations that he offers on Merleau-Ponty's systematic discussions of perception, embodiment, and thinking. When classical phenomenology is framed as a burden to be left behind, or as a relic of Lockean-Cartesian mentalism or Leibnizian rationalism, then all its analyses of phenomena, all its conceptual distinctions, and all its methodological inventions have to be dispensed with. This concerns a vast stock of tools and results that Merleau-Ponty found in Husserl's works: the concepts of passive synthesis, sedimentation, and pre-conceptual types;[2] the analyses of embodiment, spatiality, and thinghood; and the methods of genetic analysis and radical reflection. In the following, I will discuss in brief the main thematic problems. I start from Carman's claim that Merleau-Ponty puts forward a general philosophy of perspectivism.

Carman argues that Merleau-Ponty's main invention was the bodily and perspectival structure of sense-perception and that his aim was to apply his perspectival analysis to all forms of experiencing and understanding, from the sciences to politics and arts. He argues: "Merleau-Ponty undertakes an ambitious … program of extending his phenomenological insight beyond sense perception into a general account of the perspectival structure of all human experience and understanding" (3, cf. 9).

The problem with this interpretation is that it neglects Merleau-Ponty's way of posing his problems and his methods for solving them. The philosophical task that Merleau-Ponty sets in Phenomenology concerns origins of experiencing, and the methods that he proposes are genetic-phenomenological:

Until some means has been discovered whereby we can link the origin and the essence or meaning of [the experience]; until some definition has been found for a concrete essence, a structure of [the experience] which shall express both its generality and its particularity, until phenomenology has become genetic phenomenology, unhelpful versions to causalism and naturalism will remain justified (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995).

The aim is not to capture the general structures of all experiencing and all understanding. Rather, Merleau-Ponty inquires back into the intentional ground of experience and tries to disclose a primordial form of conscious life that lies hidden under the sedimentations that support our everyday experience and our sciences. This life is the life of a human animal which orientates in lived space, moves through the elements of air and water, and approaches its objects in desire or else avoids them in aversion. Merleau-Ponty does not claim that we are nothing but such animals, nor does he suggest that all the forms of our understanding -- mathematical, logical, linguistic, and aesthetic -- are bound by the structures of our perceptual lives. His argument concerns the genetic constitution of consciousness: all our achievements, physical and spiritual, have emerged historically, and must emerge, from a perceptual ground by different sorts of operations -- individual and communal.

Merleau-Ponty received from Husserl the concept of horizon.[3] Both philosophers argue that all experiencing is horizontal, that is, all experiences refer, by internal links of sense, to other experiences. Moreover, Merleau-Ponty uses the concept of horizon to characterize the givenness of the world and describes it as the "horizon of horizons" and the "style of all styles" ([1945] 1995: 330). The perspectival structure of sense-perception is just one specific type of horizontality, and this structure is lacking from many experiences and many entities that belong to our everyday life and to our scientific practices.[4] A literary work, such as Simone de Beauvoir's She Came to Stay for example (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1964), is not given through perspectival adumbrations or by spatial profiles,[5] even if it refers by its sense to a whole history of writing. The spatiality of thingly perception must not be confused with the historicity of communication (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995: 432-433).

The second main problem in Carman's explication is that it separates Merleau-Ponty's account of embodiment from its Husserlian starting points and establishes a false opposition between the two. Carman argues that for Husserl the living body (Leib) is a mere material thing with an "inserted" or "introjected" psychic content (127-131), a content that moreover is always, by necessity, lent from one solipsistic subject (137-140). For Merleau-Ponty, such a notion is nonsense, as it would be for anyone who is interested in human experience, including Husserl. To be sure, the idea of introjection can be found in Husserl's Ideas II ([1952] 1993: 169), but to claim that this would be Husserl's final word on the topic is simply a mistake ([1952] 1993: 175, 185-186). If one reads the whole of Husserl's Ideas II -- like Merleau-Ponty did -- and does not just focus on the two first parts which deal with the constitution of the living body as it is given in the naturalistic attitude of the sciences, then one discovers that Husserl argues that living bodies are apprehended in two different ways: on the one hand, as material things with psychic determinants within the naturalistic attitude and, on the other hand, as expressive wholes within the personalistic attitude.

In the naturalistic attitude, sense is given as a psychic content introjected into the material body, but in the personalistic attitude sense permeates the whole body, all its parts and all its levels, and connects the body to other bodies by comprehensive relations of motivation and understanding (Husserl [1952] 1993: 200ff.). Moreover, Husserl agues that the naturalistic attitude and its thingly body are dependent secondary phenomena and come later in the constitutive order of experiencing than the expressive body of the person. More precisely, the naturalistic attitude is a result of a process of abstraction in which the thinking subject forgets its own personal attachments to its environing world and absolutizes its object of inquiry, i.e., nature (Husserl [1952] 1993: 193). Thus Husserl shows that the two-layered mind-body compound, or the double psycho-physical reality, is not original in our experiencing, but is a dependent formation.

Merleau-Ponty was impressed by this idea and by Husserl's concept of the expressive body.[6] His Phenomenology is an attempt to develop further the idea of expressive relations of sense and motivation, not just as they are lived between human persons, but also as they are lived between the perceiver and his material environment and between the different aspects of our personal lives, perceptual, affective, intellectual:

The analysis of speech and expression brings home to us the enigmatic nature of our own body even more effectively than did our remarks on bodily space and unity. It is not a collection of particles, each remaining in itself, nor yet a network of processes defined once and for all -- it is not where it is, nor what it is -- since we see it secreting in itself a 'significance' which comes to it from nowhere, projecting that significance upon its material surroundings, and communicating it to other embodied subjects (Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995: 197).


Depraz, Natalie: Transcendance et incarnation: Le statut de l'intersubjectivité comme altérité à soi chez Husserl, Pris: Vrin.

Heidegger, Martin 1992: History of the Concept of Time, Prolegomena, trans. Theodore Kisiel, Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press.

Heinämaa, Sara 2003: "Selfhood, consciousness, and embodiment: A Husserlian approach", in Sara Heinämaa, Pauliina Remes, and Vili Lähteenmäki (eds.): Consciousness: From Perception to Reflection in the History of Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer, 311-328.

--- 2008: "Phenomenological reactions to Gestalt-psychology," in Sara Heinämaa and Martina Reuter (eds.): Psychology and Philosophy: Inquiries into the Soul from Late Scholasticism to Contemporary Thought, Dordrecht: Springer, 263-284.

--- 2010: "A phenomenology of sexual difference: Types, styles, and persons," in Feminist Metaphysics: Explorations in the Ontology of Sex, Gender and Identity, ed. Charlotte Witt, Dordrecht: Springer, forthcoming.

Husserl, Edmund [1913] 1962 Ideas: General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology, trans. W.R. Boyce Gibson, London: Collier MacMillan Publishers.

--- [1952] 1993: Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, Second Book: Studies in the Phenomenological Constitution, ed. M. Biemel, trans. R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer, Dordrecht, Boston, London: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

--- [1954] 1988: The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy, ed. W. Biemel, trans. David Carr, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University.

Merleau-Ponty [1945] 1995: Phenomenology of Perception, trans. C. Smith, New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul.

--- [1945] 1964: "Metaphysics and the novel," in Sense and Non-Sense, trans. Hubert Dreyfus and Patricia Allen Dreyfus, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 26-40.

Mohanty, Jitendra 1982: Husserl and Frege, Studies in Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy, Indiana, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

Steinbock, Anthony 1995: Home and Beyond: Generative Phenomenology after Husserl, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1995.

Toadvine, Ted 2002: "Introduction," in Merleau-Ponty's Reading of Husserl, eds. Ted Toadvine and Lseter Embree, Dordrecht, Boston, London: Springer.

Zahavi, Dan [1996] 2001: Husserl and Transcendental Intersubjectivity: A Response to the Linguistic-Pragmatic Critique, trans. Elisabeth Behnke, Athens: Ohio University Press.

[1] The Fregean line of interpretation has been challenged by several scholars, starting with Jitendra Mohanty's Husserl and Frege (1982) and continuing with more recent works that clarify the intersubjectivity and the historicity of meaning constitution, e.g., Natalie Depraz's Transcendance et incarnation (1995), Anthony Steinbock's Home and Beyond (1995), and Dan Zahavi's Husserl and Transcendental Intersubjectivity ([1996] 2001).

[2] On Husserl's concept types, see Heinämaa 2010.

[3] Husserl connects his concept of horizon to William James' concept of fringe (Husserl [1954] 1988: 264).

[4] For Carman, the main elements of perspectives are finitude and the contrast between figure and background. He tracks the former idea to Heidegger's fundamental ontology and the latter to Gestalt psychology. A common starting point for both is in Brentano's theory of parts and wholes that influenced the phenomenological movements through Husserl's critique of Brentano and Gestalt theory through Ehrenfels' early application (Heinämaa 2005).

[5] Strangely Carman attributes to Husserl the notion that perception is separated from the perceived thing by an "abyss" (16, 42-43, cf. 33), a notion which is in direct contrast with Husserl's repeated arguments that the perceptual object is not given in any as-if mode, by any representations or pictures, but is there in full flesh (e.g. Husserl [1913] 1962).

[6] Merleau-Ponty knew this work well and returned it to again and again when developing his own account on embodiment. For a detailed discussion of the relation of influence, see Toadvine 2002. Heidegger too knew Husserl's Ideas II, and studied it already in the 20s when preparing Being and Time (Heidegger 1992: 121). For a detailed account of Husserl's and Heidegger's early disagreement on the topic of embodiment, see Heinämaa 2003.