Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Language,

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Dimitris Apostolopoulos, Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Language, Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 311pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786611994.

Reviewed by David Morris, Concordia University


Dimitris Apostolopoulos' provocative book introduces a new Merleau-Ponty, one for whom language and philosophy of language are so central that language is a concomitant or co-constitutive condition of phenomenology and ontology, alongside perceptual and temporal foundations. Apostolopoulos forthrightly admits this claim about linguistic "foundations" (his preferred term) challenges the usual emphasis on the primacy of perception in Merleau-Ponty. His reading will stir debates in Merleau-Ponty scholarship and phenomenology and enriches the study of the role of language in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy. It also leads to, but leaves open, deeper questions about just what language is and how it relates to what is prior to language.

Chapter 1 introduces the problem of language through Merleau-Ponty's first book, The Structure of Behaviour (1942), which, as Apostolopoulos emphasizes, runs headlong into the difficulty that its key concept, structure, appears to be a linguistic creation. An Olympic high-diver does not harbour, in their belly, an entity called a center of gravity. We draw out that center in words, as offering insights crucial to describing the point around which their falling body turns. Similarly, Merleau-Ponty's concept of structure gives insights into processes around which living behaviours turn -- yet structures are not entities standing out there in the world. Much as Vermeer picks out the glint in his subject's eye to fit his painting together, we create words such as structure to pick out features that let us fit together our descriptions and explanations of the world.

The question is whether language is just a glint in our mind's eye and just how it relates to what it claims to describe. Apostolopoulos articulates this issue through a distinction in Merleau-Ponty's French terminology, between sens, as a meaning "we encounter in perception," versus signification, "more abstract or conceptual meanings" (22), a distinction that has often been overlooked in analyses of Structure. Our word structure is a case of signification, but, like center of gravity, it does its conceptual work in tracking what we perceive as sens. Philosophy's need for linguistic significations that are descriptively about perceptual sens is the crux of the abovementioned issue of linguistic foundations. Apostolopoulos is right to emphasize that it "leads Merleau-Ponty to an outline of a principle that he will refine and develop over the course of his career. This principle holds that 'the properties of the phenomenal field are not expressible in a language that would owe nothing to them.'" (26, citing Structure). This captures the central problem: philosophy needs to express itself through language, but this language speaks about the world or being, not language. What does language owe to the world or being about which it speaks?

Apostolopoulos amplifies this question and its significance for Merleau-Ponty's philosophy in his second and third chapters, through an extended study of language and its role in Merleau-Ponty's second book, Phenomenology of Perception (1945). Some context is needed to appreciate Apostolopoulos' contributions.

Language and expression have been themes of Merleau-Ponty scholarship going back to early studies (e.g., Sallis), with recent books by Kristensen, Landes, and Foti, to name a few, bringing these themes to prominence. Indeed, for Merleau-Ponty language is not simply a philosophical topic but central to his life and work: the writings of Valéry, Proust, and Claudel were closer to him than those of most philosophers; he lectured on literary language; appreciated Beauvoir for doing metaphysics in novelistic form (and perhaps ghostwrote a novel himself, about an explorer amongst the Inuit);[1] the books he completed are exquisitely crafted, with the Phenomenology selected as an exemplar of writing by the French Government for its Trésor de la Langue Française.

In this context, Apostolopoulos makes an original and twofold contribution. First, he draws a new distinction (in language, of course) between empirical expression and transcendental expression. This helps reveal how the Phenomenology's study of language proceeds at two interrelated levels: a phenomenological study of expression as empirically manifest in human conduct; a study of linguistic expression as a crucial transcendental condition of phenomenology itself. He develops this distinction across chapters two and three.

Chapter 2, on empirical expression, would warrant further appreciation in a longer review. It adds to scholarship through Apostolopoulos' very helpful "Hermeneutic Account of Linguistic Expression," wherein expression involves a triad of sedimentation, gesture, interpretation. He also draws out a theme of "authentic expression" in relation to freedom (which fits well with Smyth's results about freedom, history and literature (via Exupery) in the Phenomenology, which aren't addressed by Apostolopoulos).

Chapter 3, on transcendental expression, is more important here, since it adds a linguistic twist to previous readings of the Phenomenology as a variation on transcendental philosophy. It also lets Apostolopoulos pick up on a key point others have noted: that for Merleau-Ponty, phenomenology's effort to describe the conditions of appearings must necessarily turn into a phenomenology of phenomenology that describes its own transcendental conditions of appearing. Apostolopoulos foregrounds language as a key concomitant condition of phenomenology. For Apostolopoulos, we might say, phenomenology of phenomenology must turn into phenomenology of language.

The second part of Apostolopoulos' twofold contribution ramifies this point about language as transcendental condition, through the simple, repeated, and emphatic insight that (1) phenomenology is a descriptive project, and (2) description happens in language. No phenomenologist can deny this point. No one realizing the import of it can side-step Apostolopoulos' book, which makes valuable contributions by tracing variations on this point about language across Merleau-Ponty' work.

If you are in the game of Merleau-Ponty scholarship, and thought Merleau-Ponty was committed to the primacy of perception, you will realize that Apostolopoulos has just claimed a major hand. Either you fold or go all in. In his preferred terminology the issue is how much language is foundational for phenomenology and ontology. His emphatic argument is that language transforms experience, and without that, there just is not any possibility of description. I suspect all Merleau-Ponty scholars will grant that language is required for philosophy and is transformative of experience in some way, even creative of new sorts of describable experiences, as Apostolopoulos argues. The question will be just how much language owes to what is before it, to what Merleau-Ponty calls "silence" (see, e.g., Mazis).

It is striking here that the theme of dialectic is nearly absent from Apostolopoulos' book, until the last chapter. Merleau-Ponty often considers the sorts of distinctions Apostolopoulos draws as arising in a generative dialectical relation. Arguably, this is the case with, e.g., sens and signification, empirical and transcendental expression, language and what language is about. In chapter 3, such a dialectic is background to Apostolopoulos' approach to transcendental expression through the Phenomenology's "Cogito" chapter -- which hinges on what Merleau-Ponty calls the tacit cogito. Other scholars note how Merleau-Ponty is trying to bring Descartes's cogito down to earth, by showing how it arises from an 'everyday' cogito that is only tacit, not yet philosophical. Apostolopoulos flips this around, and adds new insights, by emphasizing how language is crucial in the transition to the philosophical cogito. Many might see his analysis and the lessons he draws from it as too one-sided: language may be crucial in lifting life into philosophy, but isn't Merleau-Ponty seeking to root this transformation in something prior?

This concern recurs in a later discussion of Merleau-Ponty's indirect ontology. Language's role in philosophy bars an ontology that could claim to directly get at things and being. Instead, what's required is what Merleau-Ponty calls an ontology from within -- and for Apostolopoulos this is an ontology from within language via "a set of philosophical concepts and categories that are informed by a sophisticated description of experience" (237-8). Other scholars, though, have taken Merleau-Ponty to be indicating a problem with language here, namely how it operates within being vs. directly from within us. It could be that Apostolopoulos is right. But, when reading passages where Merleau-Ponty traces complex interrelations between terms or claims A and B, Apostolopoulos tends to muster evidence regarding B, and lets A slip to the wayside. There is a forcefulness to the procedure, and for those familiar with Merleau-Ponty's quite supple style, this may push claims to the point of breakage and raise worries about one-sided results. (Stylistically, dialogue with different or countervailing sides of Merleau-Ponty is quite muted in Apostolopoulos' book, as is dialogue with other scholars, who rarely surface in his text, and are sparingly engaged in notes. This is unfortunate because there is a genuine tension around this point about language in Merleau-Ponty and in Merleau-Ponty scholarship.)

These substantive concerns can be put in terms of passivity as a key theme of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy. Beith has recently argued that passivity is key to the generativity of meaning, expression and language in Merleau-Ponty, echoing Merleau-Ponty's linking of language to pre-linguistic silence. Again, the issue is the process wherein language transforms experience. For Apostolopoulos, that transformation is a key condition of philosophy, a compelling point. But how does this transformation operate? Is it autonomous? Apostolopoulos argues that Merleau-Ponty's ontology, in contrast with his earlier phenomenology, places "a greater emphasis on conceptual invention and creative expression" (237). No doubt this is true of Merleau-Ponty's ontological writing (as Hass observed), and Apostolopoulos shows how this need for conceptual invention advances Merleau-Ponty's previous linguistic concerns. But can we really place so much emphasis on ontology as an operation from within language itself, without tracing its roots in silence?

Apostolopoulos' brief discussion of passivity is in chapter 5, in Part II. (This part contributes to scholarship independent of the line of argument traced here, especially chapter 4's survey of Merleau-Ponty's writings on language's role in human and natural sciences and literature, including his engagements with Saussure and recently published lecture course on Recherches sur l'usage littéraire du langage.) Chapter 5 insightfully shows how, for Merleau-Ponty, dialogue is an exemplary form of language, expression, and linguistic transformation, leading to Apostolopoulos' original point that dialogue provides the underlying model for key concepts in Merleau-Ponty's later ontology. These notably poetic concepts (reversibility and narcissism; activity and passivity; intentional transgression and encroachment; flesh) remain challenging to interpret, because Merleau-Ponty died before completing his project. Roughly, they recast the relation between subject and object in an ontologically radical way. Apostolopoulos' argument that dialogue provides Merleau-Ponty with an ontological model for this relation is sure to catch attention, and amplifies a theme of dialogue that runs deep in Merleau-Ponty (see, e.g., Dillon), with Apostolopoulos adding some astute observations about the necessity of passivity in dialogue. Nonetheless, this leaves questions. Just what does this model of activity/passivity within linguistic dialogue tell us about language as transformative out of silence? How does passivity figure within linguistic transformation as conceptual invention?

Part III advances Apostolopoulos' language-centric reading of Merleau-Ponty in relation to his later ontology. His central claim is that whereas in Merleau-Ponty's earlier work language is key in expressing what we experience, "a defining feature of his later thought" is that "language co-constitutes the meaning of experience." There is a lot at stake in the "co-", and some slipperiness around it and whether language "co-constitutes the meaning of experience" or just plain "co-constitutes experience" (188). Apostolopoulos again plays a bold hand: in his view, for Merleau-Ponty ontology is not really about being as such, but is rather about the linguistic-conceptual frameworks which co-constitute our experience. If I am reading him right, in effect his view is that we are to understand Merleau-Ponty's key term, "flesh" (Merleau-Ponty's name for a previously unnamed element of being), not as an elemental entity or being, but as a new sort of description or linguistic naming of being. "Flesh" names the complex being of the dialogue-like relation between subject and object. Just what Merleau-Ponty meant by "flesh" is a heated topic of debate. I'd imagine most scholars would agree that the concept flesh is meant to describe this relation and indeed some have understood it in terms of a logos. I take it that Apostolopoulos' bold addition is that "flesh" doesn't name anything further than this conceptual-descriptive complex: it operates like the term "structure," it's a glint in language's eye and in our experience -- not a glint in being.

Apostolopoulos' analysis proceeds in two chapters. Chapter 6 advances the co-constitution view in terms of language as world-forming. This includes valuable discussions of "meaning as cohesion, and Merleau-Ponty's relation to figures such as Cassirer and Humboldt (resonances with Wittgenstein and Goodman on world-making become apparent here). Where chapter 6 focuses on the content of ontology as shaped by language, chapter 7 focuses on the form of ontological investigation, deploying previous results about transcendental expression and dialogue to provide a language-informed window into key methodological themes in Merleau-Ponty's The Visible and the Invisible, including hyper-reflection, interrogation, and philosophy as operational language. Altogether, Apostolopoulos' view is that the visible is perceived meaning and the invisible is that meaning expressed in language . The Visible and the Invisible concerns this relation as a linguistic matter, involving language's transformation and co-constitution of experience. On the other hand, Apostolopoulos urges that the interrelation between invisible linguistic meaning and visible perceptual meaning in Merleau-Ponty is very different than Heidegger's view of language as the house of being.

This brings us back to the running problem above: just what is language and how does it relate to what language is about? In the end, I don't have a good sense of Apostolopoulos' answer, for I am not precisely certain just what his own view of language is. I searched for a definition of what he takes language to be, but wasn't successful (and "language" isn't in the index). His claims about Merleau-Ponty's texts and relations between terms in Merleau-Ponty are very clear; he's not as clear on what these terms are really about. The book seems to presuppose that what language is is obvious -- even while provoking deep questions as to what language is and how it gets going, such that it transforms and makes available experience as a matter for philosophy. And if various human languages invent different ways of transforming experience, wouldn't this mean that ontologies proliferate with languages? But aren't all of these sharing in a common being? What are language's boundaries: is infant expression a part of it already? Do musical and painterly expression have some role in language? What about language-like behaviour in animals, especially ones taught by humans, e.g., Chaser, the Border Collie who appeared to respond to 1000 words in meaningful ways? If language seeps back into living behaviours, then what, finally, are we saying, when we emphasize that ontology involves conceptual invention and creative expression? (237). How much does ontology owe to language, how much to being? Merleau-Ponty's deepest dialectical or dialogical concern is, perhaps, philosophy's relation to non-philosophy (a theme barely mentioned), a concern, we could say, with who is doing the talking when philosophy talks about being.

Put another way, Merleau-Ponty is arguably a philosopher more interested in letting phenomena reveal better philosophical problems than he is in solutions. Apostolopoulos' innovative and detailed reading contributes a great deal to scholarship by showing how language keeps informing Merleau-Ponty's solutions to his problems, and how problems of language underlie his problems. But Apostolopoulos' forceful readings and emphasis on linguistic solutions tend to bypass deeper problems about language itself. (A hermeneutical problem is also bypassed: if Apostolopoulos is right that language is transformative of what we talk about, this must hold of texts we talk about, which complicates our claims about them -- readings are creative too, as Merleau-Ponty well acknowledged.)

Apostolopoulos' contributions, I think, are the beginning, not the end, of a problem since, as he too acknowledges, Merleau-Ponty's philosophy remains troubled by the problem of the relation between language and what language is about. Apostolopoulos helps us rethink this beginning problem. Briefly, if he is right about language's co-foundational role in philosophy, then, by the very terms of his own argument, just being able to say this would not be enough. There is a further problem of the other side of this co-foundation, that is marked in language, yet not exhausted by that linguistic marking. It is best to give the last word to Merleau-Ponty (1968, 130):

Seeing, speaking, even thinking . . . are the repeated index, the insistent reminder of a mystery as familiar as it is unexplained, of a light which, illuminating the rest, remains at its source in obscurity. If we could rediscover within the exercise of seeing and speaking some of the living references that assign them such a destiny in a language, perhaps they would teach us how to form our new instruments, and first of all to understand our research/search, our interrogation, themselves.


Alloa, Emmanuel. 2019. Le premier livre de Merleau-Ponty, un roman. Chiasmi International: Trilingual Studies concerning Merleau-Ponty's Thought 21: 253-268.

Beith, Don. 2018. The Birth of Sense: Generative Passivity in Merleau-Ponty's Philosophy. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press.

Hass, Lawrence. 2008. Merleau-Ponty's Philosophy. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

Mazis, Glen. 2016. Merleau-Ponty and the Face of the World: Silence, Ethics, Imagination, and Poetic Ontology. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. 1964. Metaphysics and the Novel. In Sense and Non-sense. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.

Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. 1968. The Visible and the Invisible. Translated by A. Lingis. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press. Original edition, 1964.

Smyth, Bryan. 2014. Merleau-Ponty's Existential Phenomenology and the Realization of Philosophy. London: Bloomsbury.

[1] Merleau-Ponty (1964); Alloa (2019).