Laughter, Humor, and Comedy in Ancient Philosophy

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Pierre Destrée and Franco V. Trivigno (eds.), Laughter, Humor, and Comedy in Ancient Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2019, 286pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190460549.

Reviewed by David Konstan, New York University







                                           Imgres 2


Laughter and humor take various forms. The warm, inclusive mirth shared by family and friends is palpably different from mockery or a smirk at an enemy's discomfiture. Then there is the sympathetic, almost existential pleasure aroused by jokes at one's own expense, which provide relief from the poses that society demands. The ancient Greek and Roman philosophers were alert to these distinctions, and also to the ways in which the most innocuous kind of wit might conceal a certain malice. Of course, there are other ways to explain comedy. Some theories emphasize incongruity, others surprise, others still the violation of social codes or attention to the nether functions of the body. These aspects are noted in passing by the classical thinkers, but, as the contributors to this fine volume make clear, it was not their primary focus.

The introduction by the editors, Pierre Destrée and Franco V. Trivigno, explains the organization of the book in three sections, on the psychology of laughter, the norms that govern humor, and the way philosophers make use of humor in their works. In fact, there is no sharp division among the chapters, and, as is to be expected, a good deal of overlap. As the editors note (8), the primary type of humor turns out to be abrasive or polemical, and Plato's treatment of humor in relation to phthonos ("envy," "malice") is a theme that runs throughout. It is also the focus of the opening chapter, by Trivigno, who observes that "Plato's explicit theorizing about laughter and comedy is . . . focused on particular sorts of laughter that are presented as morally harmful" (13). Laughter poses a double danger: it threatens to become uncontrollable and overwhelms one's judgement, appealing as it does to the lower part of the soul. Furthermore, the pleasure it provides is mixed, as Plato argues in the Philebus, since the envious feel pain at the success of others even as they delight in the anticipation of their failure. In the Laws, however, Plato contemplates dividing "comedy into two kinds, according to whether it is playful [paizein] or not" (935D), the latter being free of animosity. When Socrates makes fun of his interlocutors, Trivigno suggests, his humor is not hostile but aims at their moral improvement. Whether this counts as playful is perhaps questionable.

Destrée notes that many of Aristotle's examples of jokes involve incongruity or surprise, and yet "one can hardly miss a certain mark of hostility, or animosity" (36). Even though, in the Poetics, Aristotle insists that what is laughable should not convey pain (1449a32-37), there is nevertheless an element of aggression in satirizing what is ugly or deformed. Destrée denies, however, that there is any specific emotion associated with humor. There is also a non-aggressive kind of humor, which Aristotle calls eutrapelia (NE 4.8; cf. Rhetoric 1389a-b). As Destrée remarks, "there is no reason to believe that comedians should aim at exercising eutrapelia . . . This is a virtue that should be cultivated in social gatherings, especially between friends" (48). We see again the division between antagonistic and benign humor that runs through ancient reflections on the topic.

R. J. Hankinson examines the medical tradition concerning laughter "as a diagnostic tool" (52), with special reference to Democritus' alleged tendency to find absolutely everything funny. The basic text here is the fictional correspondence between Hippocrates and the Abderites, who are worried about the possible dementia of their most notable citizen. Was Democritus suffering from melancholia, or was he rather the wisest of all, irrepressibly amused by the comedy of human life, even at its most tragic? The Hippocrates of the epistolary novel opts for the latter explanation, which Hankinson finds unsatisfactory, given Democritus' unstable behavior; one wonders, though, why the author concluded on this note. Hankinson observes that a common measure today of when a symptom such as laughter ought to be regarded as pathological is if it "seriously affects the patient's ability to lead a normal life" (76), and on this basis he entertains a doubt as to whether "Democritus" can be diagnosed as suffering a disease of the soul on this account.

Plato worried about laughter but his dialogues offer many instances of it. Plotinus, as Malcolm Heath shows, was far more sober, and "Porphyry preferred laughter that did not go beyond a smile. It may therefore be significant," Heath adds, that "there is one Plotinian smile" (81). Why so reticent? Heath suggests that Plotinus' habitual mildness was incompatible with aggressive humor. Even where he seems to be attacking Longinus (a contemporary critic whom Heath has elsewhere argued is in fact the author of On the Sublime) by calling him a philologos rather than a philosophos, he is indulging in wordplay rather than nasty polemics. In Plato, by contrast, "laughter is plentiful, and often aggressive" (86), although in his more intimate dialogues, "good-humored laughter is common" (87). The account of laughter in the Philebus, Heath observes, cannot explain all the instances of humor in Plato's own writings. Over time, the negative view of laughter hardened. Aristotle had observed that among animals, only human beings laugh. For Iamblichus, this was precisely a sign of our mortal nature, whereas we ought to aspire to the divine. What, then, are we to make of the "unquenchable laughter" of the Homeric gods? Answer: it "signifies divine providence towards the phenomenal world" (96, citing Proclus, Commentary on Plato's Republic 127.9-11). It is not so much a guffaw as a sign of play.

Part II opens with Matthew D. Walker's chapter on Aristotle's notion of wittiness. Walker asks, reasonably enough, why wit should be treated as a virtue rather than simply a social skill. His answer is that "wittiness concerns a specific kind of non-rational desire, namely, epithumia for the pleasures of laughter" (107). A proper degree of wit, neither excessive nor deficient, is thus comparable to the virtue of self-control (enkrateia) or temperance (sōphrosunē) in relation to appetites for food, drink, and the like. Aristotle's view differs from the superiority theory of laughter; rather, the buffoon is disposed to find humor especially in bodily functions. The witty person is "capable of granting the appetite for laughter its appropriate -- necessary -- place in human life" (117). As a virtue, however, amusement should be serious, an apparent contradictio in adiecto; but in fact, the exercise of this virtue is serious, save that, as a form of recreation, it does not involve the exercise of the full range of virtues. There is much to be said for Walker's interpretation, if we can grant that the desire for the pleasure of laughter is indeed comparable to that for food, drink, and sex.

Charles Guérin, in an elegant contribution, notes the two sides of humor that Cicero distinguishes, the one aggressive, and primarily public, as in his speeches, the other kindly, and deployed in private occasions and among friends. Yet both "friendly jokes and aggressive witticisms belong to a continuum" (123). One must take account especially of the purpose of humor: whether it is for enhancing human relations, enforcing communal norms, or promoting the ethical integrity of the individual. Cicero's letters, marked by a conversational tone (sermo), advance the first of these objectives. Cicero's speeches, on the contrary, deploy wit as a means of crushing an opponent. At the same time, however, they are a means of affirming ostensibly communal values and excluding those who are the object of criticism. But Cicero is also concerned, as Aristotle was, with decorum and the behavior proper to a free person (liberalis). In all its aspects, Guérin concludes, Cicero "always views laughter as a tool used to enhance the cohesion and strength of the community" (141).

Michael Trapp examines the role of humor in Dio Chrysostom and Plutarch, neither of whom, as he puts it, is usually thought of as "a barrel of laughs." In Dio too, laughter occurs "in two carefully differentiated forms" (147). There is the laughter of "natural ease and reciprocal affection," as in the hunter's home in the Euboean Oration (Or. 7), but also the "superior, derisive laugh" of a prosecutor ridiculing his victim (150-51). So too in Plutarch, jests are "welcome in the right places" (155), and Plutarch disapproves of a wife who is reluctant to join in the merriment of her husband for fear of appearing wanton (Praecepta Coniugalia 142A), even as he recognizes that "derisive laughter has its place in public life" (156). But uncontrolled laughter, as in Plato and Cicero, also poses a threat to both individual and collective well-being, and seemliness in laughter is a mark of ethical and social distinction.

Paul B. Woodruff's more speculative chapter on Socratic self-ridicule, which opens Part III, begins with the startling declaration, "Ridicule is the handmaid of reverence" (165). Woodruff explains that the modern world has no conception of reverence as the ancient Greeks understood it. Ridicule is necessary to cut us humans down to size, limiting the presumption that is an offence against the gods. If the elenchus that Socrates practices puts others to shame, his "genius is that he knows how to see himself as ridiculous" (167). The Hippias Major (a text that many doubt is by Plato) makes it clear that "Our human quest to live well is ridiculous: we have ambitions that we cannot satisfy" (176). Here too, then, there are two kinds of laughter, which (I suggest) are aligned, in a way, with public shaming and private amusement, though the private is here narrowed to self-mockery.

Mary Margaret McCabe, again looking at humor and ridicule in Plato, observes that "the experience of comedy" takes the form of "a pair of attitudes in tension with each other: enjoyment of the situation of the ridiculous object; and the pain or evil of indulging the malice" (187). I am not wholly persuaded that the pain of phthonos involves an ethical stance; it may be that envy (as we may render the Greek word) is unpleasant simply because we feel that others possess what we would like to have (and that they should not). In a series of subtle readings, McCabe shows how the narrative frame in the Protagoras, Charmides, and Euthydemus reflects a kind of physical slapstick reminiscent (not accidentally) of Old Comedy. It is just the mixture of pain and pleasure in the comic -- the inability to keep the two modes distinct -- that induces in the reader an unease, and "in the best of cases that discomfort prompts reassessment and reflection" (206).

Richard Bett examines the subversive quality of humor, above all in the skeptics. Bett begins by distinguishing two kinds of humor in Aristotle: wordplay and a critical sort that consists in making fun of others (the two may coincide, of course). Naturally, such a method will have commended itself to the skeptics, who found the entire enterprise of the dogmatic thinkers absurd, or reducible to absurdity. Bett examines the salvos of Timon of Phlius, the wit deployed by the skeptical Academy, and Sextus Empiricus' wry exposure of the dogmatists' contradictions. Thus, he shows that a "dog is fully the equal of humanity," which he marks as a kind of joke (his word is katapaizein, Outlines of Pyrrhonism 62) directed at the "demented and self-important dogmatists" (220). But systematic philosophers, even sober Stoics, make use of farce to expose their opponents, including those who think that to be a philosopher one need only mouth what one has read in books (Epictetus, Discourses 2.19).

In fact, Epicureans and Stoics alike deployed humor, as the following two chapters, by Geert Roskam and Margaret Graver, respectively, make clear. Epicurus affirmed that "One must philosophize and at the same time laugh" (Vatican Saying 41, cited p. 228), a sentiment that suits a philosophy that prizes pleasure. Yet when laughter is mentioned, it is, as Roskam notes, almost always polemical in nature, and Epicurus enjoyed coining derisive nicknames for his opponents. Mockery is often more effective than painstaking argumentation, and opponents took the Epicureans to task for evading serious discussion. Roskam cites an intriguing essay on humor ("Die Ironie der Dinge") by the Austrian poet and playwright, Hugo von Hofsmannsthal, who affirms that comedy is best written after a great war, when things seem to have lost their everyday value. Roskam suggests that the laughter of Democritus and Epicurus may have been of this sort: not malicious pleasure taken in another's misfortune but an expression of the independence and self-sufficiency of the wise. Still, the Epicureans did not indulge in Socratic self-irony; rather, they "took themselves very seriously" (238), and there is very little trace -- hardly any, in fact -- of the purely joyous laughter we might have expected of them. At best, rather later in the tradition, their contentment "becomes evident in a quiet, mild smile" (243).

Seneca was no stranger to the corrosive wit of Horatian satire -- his humor can be caustic enough, as Graver puts it, "to make the modern reader squirm" (247). But it is also the case that in his writings "humor functions as a disciplinary mechanism for the preservation of generic decorum" (246-47). Because Seneca may also direct his wit against himself, however, "The policing function of invective humor then turns into self-policing" (250). Seneca certainly marks out Stoic territory against its opponents, though he'll happily steal a phrase from them when it suits his purpose. But his self-deprecatory style also serves to define the limits of his own discourse, and in so doing, I suggest, creates a space for a more genial relation to his readers, like the friendly space that Cicero identified with sermo.

The final chapter, by Inger N. I. Kuin, examines Lucian's philosophy of laughter. Lucian subscribed to no school, and so was free, like the skeptics, to lampoon them all -- including skepticism. Nor does he limit himself to a single kind of humor; he is first and foremost a humorist, after all. Nevertheless, Kuin notes, two types stand out. That of Demonax (known almost exclusively through Lucian's essay that bears his name) is "inclusive, discursive, and self-reflective," whereas that of Diogenes, as Lucian represents him, is "exclusive, premeditated, and self-immune" (266): he can mock but cannot be mocked. Even in afterlife, the disembodied Cynics laugh at the foibles of others, though how an incorporeal entity can laugh at all is Lucian's way, as Kuin notes, of putting their stance, too, under suspicion. Demonax does not concern himself with his appearance, unlike the counter-cultural posturing of Diogenes and his crowd, who were, despite their clever ripostes, a fairly solemn bunch. It is Demonax's easy-going, tolerant style that most closely corresponds to Lucian's own sensibility.

All in all, this is a valuable collection on an important and largely neglected topic. It avoids needless invective and polemic, and it is inclusive in the variety of approaches that are discussed. Modern theories come in for mention, but the primary focus is on the ancient texts and the complex engagement with wit, both cutting and convivial, that they exhibit.