Messy Morality: The Challenge of Politics

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C. A. J. Coady, Messy Morality: The Challenge of Politics, Oxford University Press, 2008, 123pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199212088.

Reviewed by Kimberley Brownlee, University of Manchester


In this captivating volume, C.A.J. Coady examines some challenges that politics poses for morality. For Coady, the challenges include the very nature of political reality, the prevalence of moralism, the role of ideals in politics, and the spectres of deception and dirty hands. Although principally a work of political philosophy, this five-chapter book, which expands and refines Coady's 2005 Oxford Uehiro Lectures in Practical Ethics, contributes to several philosophical debates beyond those pertaining to theories of politics. Coady's analysis of the moral significance of ideals, for example, about which I say more below, is particularly illuminating independent of its relevance to political concerns. And, his discussion of political realism contributes to non-philosophical, international relations debates by outlining powerful objections to under-theorised accounts of the limitations of morality in global politics. Throughout the book, Coady blends well-informed, forthright criticism of recent policies, such as the US led invasion and occupation of Iraq, with cogent philosophical reflection and analysis.

The discussion opens with an examination of the amorphous set of views known as political realism, which broadly speaking deny the relevance of morality in politics. According to Coady, this collection of views, which lack a clear and consistent set of theoretical precepts, can be distinguished by some strands of belief: 1) a certain opposition both to idealism and to morality in international affairs, 2) an opposition to moral self-inflation, and 3) a concern for both national interest and the stability of the international order (12). Coady argues that political realism is often misunderstood by both its critics and its defenders as opposing any inclusion of morality within international politics, when it could be most plausibly presented in terms of opposition to certain distortions in morality that deserve the epithet 'moralism', such as excessive righteousness or moral self-aggrandisement. The insight of political realism, Coady claims, which can go unnoticed in the passionate rhetoric of its defenders, is that such moralism is indeed criticisable.

The concept of moralism, to which Coady devotes the first two chapters, is characterised in its pejorative sense as a vice in the ways a person either practises morality or exercises moral judgement. Coady outlines various varieties of this vice including moralism of scope (overmoralisation),[1] moralism of unbalanced focus,[2] moralism of imposition or interference, moralism of abstraction, moral absolutism, and moralism of deluded power, each of which can have deleterious effects upon opinion-forming and decision-making. It is worthwhile to sketch briefly the central elements of each before offering some evaluation Coady's treatment of moralism.

According to Coady, the first of these six varieties -- moralism of scope or overmoralisation -- is a proper target for political realist objections because it applies moral language to non-moral debates. Briefly put, when particular moral commitments loom too large in decision-making, they can encroach upon legitimate reasoning in disciplines from medicine to military operations. Coady gives the example of the debate about AIDS policy where those who oppose the use of condoms on moral grounds are sometimes led by their moral convictions to make absurd empirical claims about the ineffectiveness of condoms in preventing disease transmission. Similarly, in war, he says, adherence to a moral agenda -- such as spreading democracy -- can lead one to disregard as false any intelligence that runs counter to one's morally inspired plans (22, 27).

Equally criticisable, he says, is moralism of unbalanced focus, which arises most vividly in the domain of sexual morality. Although it is possible to hold that sexual morality is concerned with a distinctive quality in sexual relations without becoming obsessed with that quality or its significance, nevertheless there is a tendency amongst traditionalists to become so obsessed and to give undue attention to perceived sexual vices to the exclusion of other public and personal concerns (30). In non-sexual contexts too, a genuine moral value can be trumpeted so loudly that it drowns out all others. Coady gives the example of armed humanitarian intervention or 'militant humanitarianism', which may promote the genuine moral value of compassion, but disregards other weighty moral considerations (32).

Coady's third form of moralism -- moralism of imposition or interference -- is the insistence that what may be legitimate moral judgements upon one subject be imposed inappropriately upon other people (35-6). Imposition, as a form of coercion, force, or disregard for autonomy, raises questions about not only the parameters of respect for other cultures and other people's dignity, but also the proper limits of toleration, and the degrees of certainty that can attach to moral judgement. The moralism of imposition is distinct from the honestly communicated judgement that some people's conduct is immoral. And, avoiding this form of moralism does not commit us to cultural relativism as many realists think. Coady succinctly argues that cultural relativism is neither plausible on its merits nor plausible as a vehicle for securing toleration since

advocacy of toleration requires resort to subtle and complex reasoning and insight that goes beyond parochial standards … Robustly tolerant practices spring from a vigorous human virtue that can be recommended to all people, not from some supposed incapacity to think beyond the boundaries of one's own social conditioning. (36-7)

The fourth and fifth forms of moralism -- abstraction and absolutism -- could be treated under the same heading, Coady acknowledges, but have distinctive features that he thinks are worth highlighting. The insight in the political realist's frustration with abstract moral reasoning is that such reasoning purports to cover the world in a uniform, moral blanket that is insensitive to relevant differences in context and circumstance. The point to take away from this complaint, Coady says, is not that the virtue of generosity is an inappropriate attitude for a Prince, for example, but rather that the proper exercise of virtue is highly sensitive to context (39). (As an aside, in defence of abstract reasoning, this political realist objection will find its mark only in weak normative theoretical targets since the best abstract reasoning is not context-insensitive.) Concerning absolutism, Coady states that the political realist insight is to object to the kind of moral inflexibility or fanaticism that is disdainful of exceptions and of errors. The tendency to demonise those who are perceived as malevolent (such as Saddam Hussein or Islamic communities) or who appear to fall short of some expressed standard, is a dangerous practice that realists are right to oppose. Finally, the sixth form of moralism -- moralism of deluded power -- is not a form of distorted moral judgement as such, but rather a mistaken or overconfident belief in the power of moral judgements, standards, and principles to effect changes in behaviour (45).

Although Coady masterfully elucidates the ways in which our moral reasoning can be flawed, nonetheless, by seeking to taxonomise forms of moralism, he may inadvertently concede too much to the political realist. For example, distinguishing moralism of scope from moralism of unbalanced focus fosters the impression that in some contexts moral considerations simply do not apply (scope) and, in other contexts, moral considerations do apply, but their importance should not be overstated (unbalanced focus). Coady may nod and agree with this, but his actual purpose is not, or should not be, to circumscribe the range of contexts to which moral reasoning may be said to apply, but rather to highlight that moral reasoning should not intrude improperly upon other domains of first-order reasoning, such as scientific or mathematical reasoning, which cannot function well as independent domains of reasoning if what counts as legitimate inquiry or argumentation is subordinated to moral constraints.[3] The example of the AIDS debate is a case in point. By contrast, Coady's other purportedly scope-related example noted above -- the effort to spread democracy through war -- is better understood as a moralism of unbalanced focus than of scope since war is undoubtedly a context in which morality matters. And, it is actually the over-inflation of the democratic ambition to the exclusion of other moral considerations that makes such 'crusades' criticisable moral distortions.

Coady acknowledges that the categories of moralism overlap, but he does not comment on possible implications of his project of taxonomising the ways that we can be morally shortsighted or hubristic. As my above observation suggests, a potential implication of Coady's project is that it will foster some of the very distortions in moral thinking that Coady seeks to combat, such as distortions in our comparisons of moral matters and distortions in our assessment of categories of conduct, intentions, and outcomes. That said, in taking seriously the best version of political realists' criticisms of moral reasoning, Coady has walked through an analytic minefield, tossing grenade-size objections at many realist claims while keeping his grip on a plausible moral objectivism.

The examination of common shortcomings in moral reflection is an appropriate prelude to Coady's analysis of the nature and influence of ideals. In Chapter 3, Coady does much to vindicate this neglected, and sometimes ridiculed, moral concept by situating it amongst familiar moral furniture such as duties, goals, and values. Coady distinguishes ideals from ordinary goals and ordinary values by explicating four key features of ideals. First, ideals are more comprehensive and general than most goals are. The ideal of musical virtuosity is more comprehensive and general than the goal of attending an opera once a month. Second, ideals garner esteem from the person who pursues them, something that a goal need not do; the person who pursues or acknowledges an ideal ranks it highly as a good. Third, ideals are more pervasive and constitutive than ordinary goals are. Anyone who is possessed of an ideal 'acts now in the light of that ideal and does not merely do certain ideal-neutral things that will bring about the ideal in some remote future.' (57) Through cultivation, an ideal, like a virtue, comes to exist to a greater or lesser degree in the agent as the agent seeks to live it. Finally, ideals often are to different degrees and for different reasons unrealisable, a feature that most thinkers who have considered ideals regard as vital to distinguishing them from ordinary goals.

Ideals, even genuinely valuable ideals, can pose difficulties in our personal lives and in politics when the persons who undertake to cultivate a given ideal become fanatical about its pre-eminence and let its pursuit overdevelop at the expense of other values, commitments, and ideals. Coady acknowledges the possibility of such dangers, but denies that they are inevitable or intractable. His examination of ideals signposts several paths for further philosophical exploration, such as 1) where to place ideals as a class on the spectrum of realisability and unrealisability, 2) what that implies for the regulative or non-regulative role that ideals might play in practical reasoning, 3) whether ideals can be proper objects of intentions or tryings, and 4) how ideals relate to the aspiring attitudes that can be appropriately adopted toward them.

In the final two chapters of Messy Morality, Coady turns his attention to the two related topics of dirty hands and lying. Concerning the former, Coady offers a cogent critical examination of Michael Walzer's famous views on dirty hands and supreme emergencies. Concerning the latter, Coady briefly traces the history of philosophical positions on lying, from Plato's defence of the noble lie in The Republic[4] to St Augustine's and Immanuel Kant's blanket condemnation of lying to Henry Sidgwick's defence of a utilitarianism that 'ushers itself from the room' on the grounds that disastrous results would flow from everyone knowingly acting upon a principle of utility. Coady notes a general hesitancy about distinguishing lying from other forms of deceit such as obfuscating, deliberate misleading, and evading. He also notes the sneaking suspicion in much contemporary thinking that lying and other forms of deception are sometimes excusable and sometimes even justifiable (104). Here, as in his earlier chapters, Coady treads carefully through difficult moral terrain, balancing acknowledgement of political realities against the analytic demands of good moral reasoning.

Coady's elephantine topic stretches the seams of this five-chapter suitcase when the necessity for brevity prompts him to truncate his analyses of moral failings and moral aspirations. But perhaps it is desirable that the analyses in this prolegomenon remain brief since that relaxes the worry that Coady is preaching to the normative theory choir while the political realists, who could profit from reading his reflections, remain unrepentantly absent from the debate. This brief review does not do justice to the philosophical nuggets that Coady offers up, which are complemented by his gifts for apt quotation and apt reference to real cases. The book is a deceptively enjoyable read that, despite its size, makes a valuable contribution to important topics in normative theory and political philosophy.

[1] This involves seeing things as moral when they are not or enlarging small moral matters into grand ones.

[2] This involves giving an unbalanced weighting to one set of moral concerns over others.

[3] That said, we do impose strict normative restrictions on the kinds of inquiries that can be undertaken in math and science and the methods of inquiry that can be used in those inquiries.

[4] Summarising the noble lie, Coady says:

Plato defends the idea that rulers should lie to their citizens where it is for the citizens' benefit, and this follows naturally from his claim that the rulers themselves should be deceived, if possible, by a 'noble lie' about their origins. The different classes of society were to be made to believe that they were fashioned differently by God (the rulers having a quantity of gold in their make-up where farmers and craftsmen had only iron and brass) so that they would more readily accept their roles.

C.f. Plato, The Republic, 459c and 414d (any edition).