Meta-metaphysics: On Metaphysical Equivalence, Primitiveness, and Theory Choice

Placeholder book cover

Jiri Benovsky, Meta-metaphysics: On Metaphysical Equivalence, Primitiveness, and Theory Choice, Springer, 2016, 135pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319253329.

Reviewed by Tuomas E. Tahko, University of Helsinki


Jiri Benovsky's book continues the recent methodological trend in analytic metaphysics. This area of research is typically labelled 'meta-metaphysics' or 'metaontology'.[1] But as is typical of much of the work in this area, Benovsky's book also discusses a number of first order issues in metaphysics, such as bundle theory, endurantism and perdurantism, and presentism and eternalism. Accordingly, the book should be of interest to those who work in these areas as well. The book is short but dense. Previous familiarity with the relevant metaphysical theories is certainly required to fully appreciate it since there are no needless repetitions or lengthy introductions in it. I consider this a virtue, although it does entail that reading the book requires some concentration.

The book consists of two parts. The first concerns theory equivalence in metaphysics, with three primary case studies, and concludes with an analysis of the role of primitives in metaphysical theories. The second part considers different strategies for theory choice in metaphysics. One chapter is devoted to criticizing the usefulness of various theoretical virtues that metaphysicians often refer to, using trope theory, universalism, and nominalism as examples. Another chapter concerns intuitions and is largely based on Benovsky's recent paper 'From Experience to Metaphysics: On Experience-based Intuitions and their Role in Metaphysics' (2015). The final chapter puts forward Benovsky's central claim, namely, that aesthetic properties (which he takes to be grounded in non-aesthetic properties) are central for theory choice in metaphysics. Some other chapters also reuse Benovsky's earlier published material.

Already in the Preface, Benovsky makes a methodological claim, which he consistently follows throughout the book: 'the best way to do meta-metaphysics is to do first-level metaphysics' (p. vi). This claim is certainly at least partly true, as it would be difficult to engage in a methodological analysis of a discipline without engaging with any first order debates. However, I would regard an almost equally important task of meta-metaphysics to be studying theoretical virtues and other methodological issues in their own right and especially comparatively, contrasting them with the methods used in other disciplines, the natural sciences in particular. Benovsky does pursue this latter theme, mainly in Chapter 5, but the discussion is rather brief: central theoretical virtues, such as parsimony and simplicity, are essentially covered in just two pages (pp. 84-86); three pages are devoted to explanatory power (pp. 86-90). It would have been nice to see more critical engagement with the growing literature on these themes, but in fairness to Benovsky's project, let us now focus on the first-level issues that make up the bulk of the book.

In the first chapter, Benovsky argues that two pairs of well-known theories are metaphysically equivalent. The first case study is trope bundle theory and substratum theory (with tropes) concerning material objects, and the second concerns relationism and substantivalism about time. The first case study, which is based on Benovsky's 2008 paper, will serve as a good example of what I take to be his central criterion for metaphysical equivalence. In fact, he puts this criterion forward as the following slogan: 'metaphysical theories are equivalent if they do the same job in the same way' (p. 4). This is specified later in the chapter (p. 22), when Benovsky introduces the notion of a 'problem-solver'. If the respective 'problem-solvers' of two theories are both primitive and do the same job in the same way (they have the same functional role), then those two theories are metaphysically equivalent. Since I do not have the space to reconstruct his case studies in detail here, I'll get straight to the point: what makes bundle theory and substratum theory equivalent, Benovsky argues, is the fact that they both resort to a primitive 'unifying' device in order to explain how properties (tropes) are grouped together to form a single object. Benovsky considers a number of views under each label, claiming that they do not differ very significantly -- this is exactly because they postulate a similar unifying device. In the case of bundle theory, the relevant primitive is sometimes called 'compresence', while the equivalent primitive in substratum theories is typically called 'substratum' or 'bare particular'.

Benovsky is certainly on the right track here, since evaluating the primitives of two theories is surely central in our attempts to determine whether the theories are equivalent. But even if he is correct in that bundle theory and substratum theory rely on a similar primitive unifying device when it comes to explaining what groups the properties of individuals together, there could presumably be some other difference between these theories. Indeed, I think that there is: one key motivation for bundle theory (either with tropes or universals) is to get by without the category of substance, whereas at least some of those in favour of substratum theory would consider the category of substance to be the most fundamental, following the Aristotelian tradition.[2] So one might think that the broader context of these theories should be taken into account when evaluating their equivalence -- even if two theories are equivalent in one respect (having the same kind of 'problem-solver' for one issue), this does not mean that they would be equivalent in all other respects.

Benovsky does consider a strategy like this in Chapter 5, §7; he calls this 'widening the net'. He acknowledges the usefulness of this strategy in general, but problematizes it by way of asking just how wide we should go. Perhaps this is a genuine problem. However, the case that Benovsky chooses as the example in this brief section is an extreme one, namely, deriving morally unacceptable consequences from Lewisian modal realism. It is indeed arguable that moral considerations are not something that we should take into account when comparing two metaphysical theories. But the proponents of bundle theory and substratum theory would disagree precisely on metaphysical issues, such as the number of fundamental ontological categories. It is not difficult to see that this difference has been the basis of numerous metaphysical systems that are not easily equivocated.

Moving on to Chapter 2, where Benovsky discusses the debate between endurantists and perdurantists, we can see that he is certainly skilled in identifying the relevant 'problem-solvers' of metaphysical theories. Regarding this debate, which is sometimes taken as a good example of a merely verbal, non-substantial debate, Benovsky tries to find a middle ground: although he regards the debate as largely verbal, there is still some room for disagreement. In particular, he thinks that the views are structurally different (p. 39). I will not attempt to evaluate this claim here, but I'm tempted to point out that the assessment of whether this particular debate or other debates are verbal, merely verbal, or something in between will likely depend on how we understand 'merely' and 'verbal'. Benovsky doesn't discuss this issue in any detail, although at least David Chalmers's (2011) influential article on verbal disputes would surely have been relevant. Carrie Jenkins's more recent article (2014) helps to clarify the issue further. Again, these are articles that do not so much engage with first-level issues, contrary to Benovsky's stated preference, so he may have omitted them quite knowingly. Still, judging whether a debate is merely verbal or not will, at least to some extent, depend on our analysis of these notions.

Chapter 3 completes the picture, as Benovsky gives an example of what he regards as two non-equivalent metaphysical theories: presentism and eternalism. This makes for a fairly plausible case, especially when one takes into account the input that the special theory of relativity (STR) brings to the table -- it is often thought that STR is incompatible with presentism (although see Katherine Hawley 2006). Benovsky's case is based on a different point though, as he demonstrates that presentism is not compatible with perdurantism whereas eternalism is; hence, they do not always play the same theoretical role. In the course of examining this debate, Benovsky makes a valuable observation, which I'd like to highlight. This observation concerns the role of inter-translatability between theories, which he, I think rightly, considers not to indicate equivalence (p. 52). Perhaps a more helpful way of putting this would be to say that while inter-translatability is necessary for equivalence, it is not sufficient. As Benovsky notes, one would need to demonstrate that the relevant theories (also) do the same job in the same way.

In Chapter 4, Benovsky briefly recaps the methodological lessons that he drew from the case studies, focusing on the importance of primitives in theories. This chapter moves from first-level metaphysics to more methodological considerations and the same trend continues in Chapter 5, which I have already drawn on above. Chapter 6 is perhaps the book’s strongest, as it is based on Benovsky's excellent 2015 article. The chapter contains a critical discussion of the use of intuitions in metaphysics, using interesting case studies. The focus is on experience-based intuitions and it is hard to argue, e.g., with Benovsky's point regarding the similarity of phenomenal experience between the friends of unrestricted and restricted metrological composition (p. 98). The more detailed case studies concern our experience of time and change, where Benovsky draws on empirical data from psychology. His conclusion is that experience-based intuitions are in general not a reliable methodological tool in metaphysics.

This takes us to the final chapter, which appears to be entirely new. Having abandoned much of the metaphysician's typical methodological toolbox for theory comparison, Benovsky offers the beauty of theories as one remaining virtue. Importantly, he regards the aesthetic properties of theories to be grounded in non-aesthetic properties and spends some time in defending this claim as opposed to the traditional supervenience thesis with respect to the aesthetic properties of art works. This is a plausible line to take, given the recent work on the much more fine-grained notion of 'grounding'. But what are the aesthetic properties of metaphysical theories grounded in? For one thing, Benovsky thinks that we have to take into account the context of origin -- for instance, he thinks that Thales's theory of water as the central element becomes more impressive in this light, even though it may fail based on some more traditional theoretical virtues. However, Benovsky identifies a problem here, as he wants to be able to allow for progress in metaphysics. Accordingly, he insists that 'generally speaking, our theories become better -- more beautiful -- over time' (p. 119).

Some of the relevant considerations regarding the aesthetic properties of metaphysical theories are based on an analogy with works of art, but I must confess that I find this analogy wanting, given that works of art are presumably created with very different goals in mind than metaphysical theories. But the analogy becomes somewhat more understandable when Benovsky makes it clear that his view leads to anti-realism: 'we should abandon the idea that metaphysical theories are true/false' (p. 124). This conclusion quite naturally follows from the combination of his critique of traditional theoretical virtues such as parsimony and simplicity and the fact that these very same virtues seem to be at least partly what he considers to ground the relevant aesthetic properties:

Some of us feel aesthetically stimulated by simplicity and parsimony with respect to basic axioms of a theory. Some of us are struck by the elegance of a view that shows great explanatory power, while others feel more attracted towards a theory that preserves one's pre-theoretical intuitions. (p. 122)

Benovsky goes on to make a much needed clarification: when he speaks about the 'substantiveness' of a disagreement, he does not have in mind the usual, realist reading of 'substantive', but instead means to rule out the disagreement being the result of some trivial and merely verbal misunderstanding (p. 127). Given this anti-realist result, I'm inclined to once again stress that a proper evaluation of the relevant theoretical virtues that ground the aesthetic properties of theories is pressing. Benovsky's account remains somewhat unfinished in this regard, even though the various case studies that he provides are quite valuable and interesting in their own right.

In sum, Benovsky presents an original if controversial meta-metaphysical picture supported by exceptionally detailed and insightful case studies. I do find that the book and Benovsky's overall picture would benefit from a more careful engagement with second order questions such as those regarding theoretical virtues, but this shouldn't be considered to count against the book. This book is without doubt crucial reading for anyone interested in the growing literature on the methodology of metaphysics, but I would regard it perhaps even more important for those interested in the various first order debates that Benovsky analyzes. Indeed, since Benovsky repeatedly urges us to focus on those first order debates, I suspect that he would be only too pleased to have such attention.


Benovsky, Jiri, (2008), 'The Bundle Theory and the Substratum Theory: Deadly Enemies or Twin Brothers?', Philosophical Studies, 141: 175-190.

Benovsky, Jiri, (2015), 'From Experience to Metaphysics: On Experience-based Intuitions and their Role in Metaphysics', Noûs, 49 (4): 684-697.

Chalmers, David, (2011), 'Verbal Disputes', Philosophical Review, 120: 515-566.

Hawley, Katherine, (2006), 'Science as a Guide to Metaphysics?', Synthese, 149 (3): 451-470.

Jenkins, C.S.I., (2014), 'Merely Verbal Disputes', Erkenntnis, 79 (Issue 1 Supplement): 11-30.

Robinson, Howard, (2014), 'Substance', The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Tahko, Tuomas E., (2015), 'An Introduction to Metametaphysics', Cambridge University Press.

[1] See Tahko (2015) for an introduction to the field as well as discussion on the usage of these labels.

[2] See Robinson (2014) for further discussion regarding the category of substance.