Metaepistemology and Relativism

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J. Adam Carter, Metaepistemology and Relativism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 298pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137336637.

Reviewed by James Chase, University of Tasmania


As J. Adam Carter observes at the outset, a lot more people do metaethics than do metaepistemology. Metaethical positions -- claims about the views, shared commitments and disagreements of those engaged in substantive ethical debates -- are, as a result, carefully articulated, and their relationships and implications examined. By contrast, substantive debates in mainstream analytic epistemology go on without the same level of close attention. This study is a partial corrective. Carter identifies as common ground in mainstream epistemology a commitment to a kind of realism about epistemic facts, objects and properties, and then considers how the epistemic relativist stands in relation to this realism -- is relativism simply incompatible with the shared tenets of mainstream epistemology? Since epistemic relativism itself comes with a story about the very nature of epistemic facthood, however, things are complicated. Carter argues that we can't assess the compatibility of relativism with the commitments of mainstream epistemology without first assessing the plausibility of epistemic relativism in itself.

Carter's book is mostly devoted to sorting through the varying motivations one might have for adopting epistemic relativism. The conclusion is against the relativist in each case, but Carter warns the mainstream epistemologist against too quickly returning to dogmatic slumbers. To the extent that there's any plausible case for a semantically motivated epistemic relativism (based on John MacFarlane's assessment context semantics), Carter thinks there will equally be evidence for an existential threat to mainstream epistemology: the concern that it studies concepts that are simply ungrounded in ordinary practice.

This is an interesting way to frame an enquiry into epistemic relativism. Technology transfer from normative ethics to epistemology has been a going concern for decades now, yielding insightful explorations of epistemic analogues of consequentialism, deontology and virtue theory. Metaepistemology has been a more stop-start endeavour, and, as Carter notes in Chapter 1, the seminal work in metaepistemology is to some extent lopsided; searching for second-order disagreements as a way of gaining purchase on first-order debates, rather than looking at the common ground (or blind spots) that lie behind mainstream epistemology as a whole. Carter's own test for common ground here is one of pragmatic presuppositions revealed through counterfactual sensitivity: s is part of the common ground between participants A and B in a dialogue if, were not-s assumed by the participants, the dialogue would be 'relevantly different'. Being common ground is then a matter of acting as if one takes s for granted. By that test, Carter argues that the prescriptive authority of epistemic facts is a matter of common ground, and so that mainstream epistemology pragmatically presupposes a kind of background realism about the entities it talks about. But the way we get to this metaepistemological realism matters. If a compelling case for epistemic relativism exists, then in turn what it is for a fact to count as authoritative shifts, and relativist epistemology is within the common ground of mainstream epistemology. Mainstream epistemology then can't simply brush relativism off as a philosophical outrage, beyond the pale.

Carter is well aware that common ground need not indicate common belief, but he does suggest that ordinarily common ground is a matter of belief. In this particular context, I'm not sure this is a safe conclusion to draw. Contemporary academic philosophy in the analytic tradition is a communal dialogic enterprise, with a focus on articulating distinct positions and exploring their inferential connections. At least to some degree, philosophers consciously coordinate their work to maximise inferential connectivity. Some participants in the original Gettier literature, for instance, bracketed concerns about the adequacy of the belief condition in the tripartite analysis in order to stay within a common ground that allowed for vigorous exploration of third and fourth factor accounts of knowledge. It could well be that many contemporary epistemologists are prepared to provisionally accept, rather than believe, common ground commitments simply to productively further dialogue in just this way. If so, the contemporary pragmatic presupposition of realism may not mark more than contingently how the dialogue is shaping up right now. It's not clear that epistemic relativism is any more unimaginable as part of the near future of mainstream epistemology than naturalized epistemology, or contextualism, was.

From Chapter 2 on, Carter's focus is on the relativism itself, and he starts with the plausibility of a global relativism. Carter acknowledges that this is a slippery doctrine, both to articulate and to come to grips with by way of counterargument, and his concern here is with setting out an overview of distinct ways of thinking about relativism as much as it is with seeing off global relativism itself. Relativism has been given content entirely negatively, as the rejection of absolutist or objectivist theses, or in terms of dependence or co-variation relations, but Carter's main interest is in 'arity' accounts of relativism: where a property p presents itself as apparently n-ary, a relativist account of p treats it as of higher degree. By way of a discussion of Protagorean relativism (and the standard objections to that view), Carter then highlights a divide within arity approaches that does duty in later chapters. In relational mode, one might with Paul Boghossian regard propositions of the form 'X is p' as proxies for higher degree relational truths of the form 'X is p relative to F'. Alternatively, non-relationally, one might with Crispin Wright see the relativity as instead a matter of the varying standards that can be brought to 'X is p': X is p, 'albeit only relatively so'. The relational approach to global relativism induces familiar dialectical self-refutation, and Carter argues by analogy with a Wittgensteinian line on the limits of rational doubt that there's no respite for the global relativist in the non-relational approach either: at least some matters must be unrelativised in order for one thing to be coherently relativised to another, on pains of ultimate incoherence. As with other arguments of this kind (if anything is to be probable, something must be certain; if anything is to be revisable, something must be unrevisable), diagnoses of incoherence can be a little quick. A global relativist might end up in paraconsistent territory, for instance, without nonsense resulting, and Carter's discussion is too brief to get into such matters. But the argument here is convincing enough to most non-relativists, and in context that's arguably enough for Carter: arguably his question about the plausibility of relativism is addressed to the non-relativist mainstream epistemological audience.

The next three chapters cover traditional (non-semantic) arguments for epistemic relativism, starting in Chapter 3 with relativist variants on the Agrippan regress argument. If I am justified in believing that p because of q, what status must q have? If justifiers must also be justified, we face a trilemma: either chains of justification run off forever, or at some point they circle around, such that my belief that p is justified ultimately by itself, or they simply stop dogmatically, with the demand for justification unmet. The same phenomenon arises at the theoretical level as the problem of the criterion: if we ask how a particular set of norms of justification is itself justified, our alternatives again appear to be regress, circularity or dogmatism. Howard Sankey suggests that relativism follows from carrying this exercise out in parallel: we ask this justificatory question at once of a range of epistemic norms, trace out the trilemma for each, and so come to see that all of them therefore have equal epistemic standing. Relativism is no more than attending to the contextually operative norms of justification. Carter raises some local objections (after all, it's going to take a lot more work to make the relativist resolution more reasonable than various forms of foundationalism or coherentism), but on the whole this chapter acts to set up the next two, by making two points. First, the argument here doesn't particularly favour relativism over scepticism. Second, the bare possibility of epistemic disagreement contemplated by this kind of argument isn't as conducive to relativism as cases of disagreement that would be regarded by those concerned as epistemically significant.

Carter then moves on to dialogic deadlock as grounds for relativism. Galileo and Cardinal Robert Bellarmine disagree about the mobility of the Earth, with Galileo appealing to telescopic evidence and Bellarmine to biblical authority. The relativist argues that a non-relativist resolution of the debate would require an Archimedean meta-norm, appropriately neutral, available to the disputants, and appropriately discriminatory. But no such meta-norm exists. By way of a nice actual example (contemporary debates about know-how), Carter makes the point that we can't arrive at the relativist claim about the non-existence of an available meta-norm merely by considering the disagreement about the point at issue or about the evidence appropriate to the issue. Are there cases in which the disputants cannot discover mutually acceptable meta-evidence?

Carter's reply at this point is a little reminiscent of R.M. Hare's defence of utilitarianism against thought experiments: we can take issue with the specifics of near-actual cases; the more remote ones are simply of doubtful relevance to us. Here the quibbling is by way of psychology: Carter thinks we have inductive reason to hold that familiar cognitive biases will at least partly sustain the inability to reach actual agreement, and so block actual cases of this kind. The conclusion here seems a little sweeping: matters might well be overdetermined, with agents subject to cognitive biases also having principled grounds for accepting distinct epistemic systems. More detail here would be useful, and might well bolster Carter's point, at least enough to put the onus back on the relativist here. The actual playing out of the Galileo case didn't involve resolution, but only because of Bellarmine's death; in practice, those accepting a similar epistemic system to the Cardinal did, as it happens, eventually shift epistemic ground. It's not so easy to find an actual case of entrenched disagreement where we'd judge both that an Archimedian meta-norm is unavailable and that disagreement wasn't being sustained by cognitive bias in some way. Carter further argues that, in any case, the dialogic argument motivates scepticism at least as well as it does relativism. Here and in Chapter 3, while that point is certainly relevant to the question of the plausibility of relativism, I'm not so sure that it coheres completely with the metaepistemological frame of this enquiry. If the upshot of Chapters 3-7 was the conclusion that either epistemic relativism or scepticism is plausible, that would itself surely have implications for the activities of mainstream epistemology, if only because the relativist way of avoiding the sceptical conclusion would itself now become theoretically critical.

Whereas dialogic deadlock is a relational matter, Carter's focus in Chapter 5 is on the circularity that arises in one's own epistemic system when one attempts to justify it; the relativist lesson, again, is meant to be that every coherent epistemic system is equally well justified. Carter skillfully lays out the various relevant positions on warrant transmission (or dependence) and circularity, before again making the familiar point that the relativist argument doesn't rule out non-relativist accounts, such as Jim Pryor's dogmatism, Wright's conservatism, or epistemic scepticism.

Returning to the semantic considerations raised in Chapter 2, in Chapter 6 Carter sets out Boghossian's critique of a fairly straightforward version of relational relativism, and then considers Martin Kusch's alternative. Where Boghossian's relativist replaces subject-predicate judgments with higher degree relational judgments, Kusch's relativist regards the epistemic predicates used in subject-predicate judgments as incomplete in a roughly open texture way: speakers in the relevant epistemic community ordinarily have no particular commitment for or against epistemic relativism, with relativism and non-relativism providing rival glosses of a common first-order epistemic system. Carter takes over Wright's criticism of relational accounts of relativism as a whole here: in both cases, a normative claim (a judgment made in light of a standard) is being glossed descriptively (judging that the standard mandates the judgment). But if this is right, Carter points out, it suggests as most plausible a non-relational (varying standards) form of epistemic relativism, and so a case for the relativist built on our linguistic practices.

In Chapters 7 and 8 Carter outlines and argues against John MacFarlane's relativism about knowledge, a prominent example of this kind of position. On MacFarlane's view, judgments of the form 'X knows that p' will be true or false depending on whether X can rule out alternatives made relevant by the context of assessment of that judgement. The view is backed by its explanatory power relative to standard invariantist, subject-sensitive invariantist and contextualist accounts of the semantics of 'know'. Carter objects that if the set of relevant alternatives is entirely a function of the context of assessment, then epistemically relevant aspects of the subject's situation can be lost. For instance, fragility cases (involving fake barns and the like) suggest that the external environment of the assessed subject can be epistemically relevant; there's no guarantee, on MacFarlane's view, that this will be imported into a context of assessment. Carter concedes in Chapter 8 that the theoretical costs here don't make MacFarlane's account come out clearly worse than competitor semantics, and here in particular limitations of space are felt: for instance, why couldn't a relativist account along MacFarlane's lines simply allow further factors along with context of assessment to determine the set of relevant alternatives?

Carter himself explores a different line: in Chapter 8 he presents an argument to the effect that any evidence from usage that MacFarlane can appeal to in favour of his relativist view is, ipso facto, evidence that the ordinary concept of knowledge is philosophically uninteresting, distinct from the concept of knowledge in philosophical play, which Carter has previously argued involves a kind of commitment to objective epistemic facts. The possibility of divergence of this kind is clearly on the agenda once the relativist's case is to be made out by appeal to linguistic practice, but for relativism to be seen off by appeal to the pragmatic presuppositions of mainstream epistemology in this way, we'd surely want those presuppositions to be more firmly grounded than by the Stalnakerian account of common ground Carter makes use of. In the last chapter, Carter does briefly consider the ways the sands of mainstream epistemology might shift, but his interest is more in outlining the implications MacFarlane's dilemma might have for the capacity of epistemology to explicate the function of knowledge attributions. To the extent we want to tell a story on which the value of our epistemic concepts rests on practical matters (identifying good informants, giving one's word, and so on), the more undermining a divergence between the ordinary and the philosophical accounts of knowledge is going to be.

This book is a valuable overview of the epistemic relativist landscape, framed by an intriguing perspective on the prospects of metaepistemology. Carter's articulation of the various relativist arguments and positions is careful, and his criticism is generally enlightening and considered. This is a useful exploration of a live and important issue.