Metaethics After Moore

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Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons (eds.), Metaethics After Moore, Oxford University Press, 2006, 397pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199269912.

Reviewed by James Lenman, University of Sheffield


This substantial collection of sixteen original papers is one of a number of publishing ventures to have recently marked the centenary of the publication of G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica.[1] It is not primarily a historical enterprise. Evidently what the editors have encouraged contributors to provide are cutting edge contributions to contemporary metaethics that engage with Moorean themes and concerns in ways that make the continuing relevance of those themes manifest. And this, to an impressive extent, is precisely what most of them have delivered.

Allan Gibbard's "Normative Properties" begins by recapitulating an argument familiar to readers of Thinking How to Live according to which we should accept the claim of Natural Constitution whereby "some broadly natural property constitutes being what one ought to do" (p. 324). This is true for any maximally decided or hyperdecided agent. So it is true for us on any way of completing our less than hyperdecided views without changing our minds. So we are committed to it.

But, as Gibbard goes on here to note, his reasoning presupposes an extremely liberal conception of properties as encompassing without restriction all functions from worlds to extensions however cumbersome and disjunctive. This conception of properties is hardly the focus of a philosophical consensus, but Gibbard is doubtful about the credibility of any alternative. Many properties which are wildly gerrymandered from the point of view of physics do explain things. The property of yellow, for example, has explanatory work to do -- it helps explain why you sent me daffodils when I had told you what my favourite colour was. Yellow only does explanatory work because of the existence of creatures with visual sensibilities like ours. But yellow existed before there were any such creatures and would have existed even had we not. And there are countless wildly disjunctive properties that have no explanatory importance in the actual world but might if some species were to come into being that was as responsive to them as we are to yellow. Though these fantastic species are not actual, the properties surely are. Given such considerations, Gibbard thinks, a liberal conception of properties starts to look pretty credible. I have here summarized only one of several seams of argument in this very rich paper (a limitation that will inevitably, I fear, be quite general in this brief review.)

Jonathan Dancy's "What Do Reasons Do?" is a densely argued essay on what he calls contributory reasons, also often called pro tanto reasons, urging that these are harder to reach a clear understanding of than might be supposed. The notion of a pro tanto command makes little sense so it is unhelpful to speak, as Hampton does, of such reasons prescribing or compelling. The "isolation approach" taken by Ross in characterizing prima facie duties fares no better. We cannot understand a contributory reason for φ-ing as something in virtue of which, in the absence of any opposing reason, one ought to φ. Thus is because something's status as a contributory reason is not independent of what other reasons are present. Thinking of a contributory reason for φ-ing as a reason in whose absence φ-ing would be less obligatory is no good either. For one thing not all reasons are deontic -- enticing reasons, such as that φ-ing would be amusing or fun, are not. And replacing "obligatory" with "valuable" or "desirable" doesn't help either. Dancy thinks some consideration can be a reason for φ-ing and yet φ-ing be even more desirable or valuable if it did not obtain: had Mary been at the party her agreeable presence would have been one of the reasons favouring attending it, but perhaps her absence allowed for a more intimate gathering than would otherwise have been possible, and that made attending it still more appealing.

Difficulties such as these in making the notion of a contributory reason clear, vex, he urges, attempts to do so by Humean realists such as Smith and expressivists such as Gibbard. The only people with much hope of adequately characterizing contributory reasons are, he suggests, intuitionists, by appealing to a notion "of being fitting in a certain respect" or "partial fittingness" (p. 53). The suggestion is intriguing but receives no development. Absent such development, it's not at all clear that Dancy has secured for the intuitionist a convincing dialectical advantage. The more so as it's not clear why the expressivist cannot simply urge that in characterizing some consideration as a contributory reason I express some complex of desires to which that consideration speaks while emphasizing that the desires in question can have all the holistically structured complexity that Dancy's discussion brings out.

Judith Jarvis Thomson's characteristically lucid and lively "The Legacy of Principia" deals mainly with expressivism. Expressivists, as she characterizes them, are impressed by Moore's Open Question Argument but, dismayed at its conclusion, reject the starting assumption that there is any such property as goodness. Normative sentences, they say, do not attribute properties, serving instead to express attitudes of approval and disapproval. That normative sentences lack any truth values is a claim from which many expressivists nowadays retreat, impressed as they are by minimalism about truth. But minimalism about truth does not impress Thomson and she thinks the retreat premature. We cannot, she goes on to suggest, legitimately argue from the premise that normative predicates are, logically speaking, predicates to the truth-evaluability of normative sentences. But she urges that the expressivist is less well placed to resist an argument from the same premise to the conclusion that normative sentences attribute properties. There is, she concedes, something right about the expressivist's frequent emphasis on the motivating force of moral judgements though it should be understood in a holistic spirit: any putative inventory of my moral beliefs, such that none of those most immediately concerned with my own action motivated me to act accordingly, would be thereby discredited as such an inventory. But this insight she thinks inadequate to warrant any claim so drastic as a blanket denial that there are any normative properties. She herself, of course, thinks there are normative properties, lots of them, but they do not include goodness as Moore conceived it. Such "thin" normative terms as "good" "right" etc. she thinks are semantically incomplete, expressing completed thoughts only when some way of being good or right or whatever is made clear. Seeing this, she argues, begins to dispel any sense we might have of a deep semantic or metaphysical gulf separating the natural and the normative.

Deep, persisting and intractable disagreement, a limited responsibility to empirical evidence, an unavoidable reliance on the deliverances of intuition, a preoccupation with normative claims whose truth is not plausibly supposed to pull any weight in the causal order: these are the features supposed to undermine the sort of nonnaturalist and realistic understanding of ethics defended by Russ Shafer-Landau in "Ethics as Philosophy". They are also however, he urges, features of philosophy more generally. Because we do not take these features of philosophy to undermine a robustly realistic understanding of its subject matter, we are entitled to be similarly resistant to any such dialectic in ethics. This appeal to philosophy as a companion in guilt would surely only be effective were the epistemology and methodology of philosophical inquiry itself less thoroughly contested than it is.

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong in his "Moral Intuitionism Meets Empirical Psychology" draws on evidence from empirical psychology to emphasize the extent to which in the making of moral judgements, we are subject to personal bias, extensive interpersonal disagreement, the clouding of judgement by emotion, pervasive risk of illusion due to framing effects and worries about the disreputable or unreliable sources of our beliefs. Because of all this, he thinks we can never be adequately justified in holding any moral belief on the basis of unconfirmed noninferential knowledge, so intuitionism in moral epistemology is hopeless.

Michael Smith, in "Moore on the Right, the Good and Uncertainty", considers the worry raised for consequentialists such as Moore by the uncertainty that attaches to the consequences of what we do. He contrasts Moore's conception of rightness as whatever maximizes value with Jackson's as whatever maximizes expected value. Jackson's subjective consequentialism is rejected as an unstable halfway house between Moore's and a highly implausible view where rightness is expected value-as-the-agent-sees-things. Smith I think rather misses the point of the epistemic worry Moore raises. The deep worry here is not, as the former seems to suppose, merely that we can't be certain of which actions will have the best consequences. A plausible consequentialism could certainly live with that. Rather, if the morally relevant consequences of an action are all of its consequences indefinitely far into the future, the problem is that our epistemic position is simply hopeless in a far more serious way than mere talk of uncertainty would imply. Smith's reading of Moore also seems doubtful when he cites Moore's contention that the difficulty is made tractable by there being "some possibility of shewing which among the alternatives, likely to occur to any one, will produce the greatest sum of good" (p. 135, quoting Principia, p. 149). "In other words," comments Smith, "in the absence of certainty about which actions maximize value, we can still say which acts are likely to maximize value, given our epistemic limitations" (p. 136). Smith's putative paraphrase appears to change rather more than the wording of Moore's rather puzzling proposal to yield a rather distinct thought. Neither thought seems adequate to the epistemic vexation Moore was addressing.

Paul Bloomfield's "Opening Questions, Following Rules" takes the open questions argument, the argument from queerness and large chunks of the rest of philosophy together to illustrate "the grand problem of normativity" supposedly characterized by Wittgenstein in the course of setting out his "rule-following considerations". This lumping together of Moore with Wittgenstein struck me as questionable and rather forced, but Bloomfield cannot compete in this respect with Panayot Butchvarov's closing paper, "Ethics Dehumanized". For Butchvarov, the global and hence "cosmological" character of Moore's consequentialism is at the root of his nonnaturalism given his definition of the nonnatural as what is not located in time. This makes it all a bit like Wittgenstein's understanding of the ethical as ineffable where this sort of ineffability has something to do with very high orders of generality. This is all, apparently, a bit like Kant and a bit like Aquinas. What all this teaches us, apparently, is that we should not think of ethical judgements as true or false but rather as valid or invalid, but please don't mistake this claim for "ordinary noncognitivism". This is all a bit like Goodman. And so on. There were moments of insight here and there in this paper but, for this reader, I fear, exasperation overwhelmed enlightenment.

Brad Hooker and Philip Stratton-Lake's "Scanlon versus Moore on Goodness" develops a different point of connection and comparison far more credibly and with considerably greater care. They contrast two views of the relationship between the evaluative and the normative: Moore's, whereby the base properties of a thing make it good and its goodness furnishes reasons for action; And Scanlon's, where goodness is the second-order property of having properties that provide reasons. Scanlon's central point, that it is implausible to think of a thing's goodness as providing an extra reason for action over and above those furnished by the base properties on which its goodness supervenes is illuminatingly developed in the course of defending his view against objections levelled by Dancy and Crisp. I haven't read a better discussion of Scanlon on buck-passing.

James Dreier in "Was Moore a Moorean?" brings his usual admirable clear-headedness to bear on the daunting project of making sense of Moore's understanding of those vexatious terms, "natural" and "intrinsic". (Following Broad, he reads them as intimately connected in Moore's mind.) Once we clear away various sources of unclarity and the unhappy false start (as Moore himself acknowledged it) of understanding the natural in terms of location in time, we are left, on Dreier's account, with a reading whereby the core feature of ethical properties leading him to deny they were "natural" and, later, "intrinsic" is the fact that they supervene on physical properties but cannot be logically deduced from them. What Moore was onto here, Dreier suggests, was the familiar distinction between the descriptive and the evaluative but, by focusing on properties rather than on predicates, he misdiagnosed as a distinction between different kinds of property -- natural and nonnatural -- what is rather a distinction between different kinds of predicate.

Sigrún Svavarsdóttir's "Evaluations of Rationality" offers an intriguing, if rather sketchy and preliminary, account of how a neo-Humean account of rationality might go. She rejects what she calls imperative and legal models of rationality, conceiving rationality (as opposed to irrationality) as the excellence of a rational (as opposed to arational) being qua rational, proposing that we understand this excellence as excellence in the use of one's cognitive capacities for achieving one's purposes, cognitive or otherwise, whatever these may be, as well as responding appropriately to the output of such cognitive activity.

Connie Rosati's "Personal Good" focuses on the question: what relationship must obtain between x and me for x to be good for me? She proposes that we take the things that are good for me as having the following four features: they support my sense of my own value; they are enlivening rather than enervating; they contribute to my sense of who I am and where I am headed; and they provide "self-perpetuating … sources of internal motivation". These features of goodness aren't mutually independent but are interconnected and mutually reinforcing. Goodness is not, she stresses, the conjunctive property of having these four features, but rather is the second-order property of being productive of them.

Stephen Darwall's broad agenda in his "How Should Ethics Relate to Philosophy?" is to defend the relevance of metaethics to normative ethics, urging that the latter is better done when engaged with and informed by the former. His main illustration of this comprises an argument that Moore's treatment of evaluative concepts as more fundamental than normative concepts is in tension with what the Open Question Argument teaches us about the normativity of evaluative concepts. As Darwall observes, Moore rather strikingly doesn't think it is an open question whether an action that would produce more goodness than any alternative is one we ought to perform. (Though as Robert Audi (p. 81) and Michael Smith (p. 133) note, Moore was later to weaken the analytic connection between normativity and intrinsic value in responding to criticism from Russell and Frankena.)

Audi's paper, "Intrinsic Value and Reasons for Action", draws on C. I. Lewis at least as much as Moore, distinguishing inherent value from intrinsic value where something is supposed of inherent value if an appropriate experience of it would be good. The "appropriate" is important here. The sadist's delight at my agony does not make my agony inherently valuable. Sadistic pleasure, says Audi, ill-befits its object. This is a matter, he suggests, of "opposing valences": such pleasure "provides a reason for producing or sustaining something that there is reason to avoid" and so involves one in "a kind of axiological incoherence" (p. 88). Considerations of what is intrinsically good ground reasons to bring such things into being and keep them there. But, as Audi stresses, this is not to presuppose that all reasons for action are grounded in considerations of value.

Horgan and Timmons' own paper, "Cognitivist Expressivism", is the longest and perhaps the most ambitious in the book. Here they urge that expressivists should drop any reservations about allowing that moral utterances are assertions and moral judgements beliefs. What they should instead do is recognize two distinctive categories of beliefs: descriptive beliefs consisting of what they call is-commitments and nondescriptive ought-commitments. Logically complex commitment states should be understood, they propose, in terms of their constitutive inferential roles. This in turn is to be understood in terms of a logical consequence relation among beliefs, one that is characterized in a short technical appendix dealing with the basic constants of propositional and predicate logic.

The account is elegant and I am certainly sympathetic to the project, but worries remain. Consider negation.[2] I know what it is to negate an is-commitment. It is just to have an is-not commitment. Commitment to the negation of p is the case is quite straightforwardly just commitment to p is not the case. But the negation of an ought-commitment is not an ought-not commitment. (Quite consistently I think it false both that I ought sometimes to visit Wales and that I ought not sometimes to visit Wales.) And it better not, if we are expressivists, be an is-not-the-case-that-ought commitment. And, whether we are expressivists or not, we better not say having a not-ought-commitment is a matter of not having an ought-commitment. The answer we get in Horgan and Timmons is just going to be that negative ought-commitments are understood in terms of their constitutive inferential role. So "not" is just the connective that behaves in a logically not-like way as described in the appendix. But it's unclear how we might understand what use we might have in our language for a connective that functioned in just this way without appealing to something like a concern to avoid inconsistency. And what are we to say, on Horgan and Timmons's account, about just what, in the context of ought-commitments, inconsistency amounts to and exactly why it is a bad thing?  But raising such issues is to ask a great deal from an already impressive paper that goes some real distance in grappling with the multiple vexations raised by the Frege-Geach Problem.

Stephen Barker's "Truth and the Expressing in Expressivism" similarly seeks to recast traditional expressivism in a way that allows moral utterances to count as assertions. This paper makes a number of radical and fundamental proposals about how we should understand the relevant issues in the philosophy of language that, in its 18-page compass, Barker can do nothing like enough adequately to motivate and defend. It nonetheless serves, much as Svavarsdóttir's paper does, as an intriguing shop-window display for a philosophical agenda which the reader must hope to find more fully elaborated elsewhere. 

In making an assertion, Barker contends, a speaker represents himself as in a certain state and sets himself up to defend some commitment. Where an assertion expresses some belief he sets himself up to defend that belief. Where it reports some belief he sets himself up to defend his so representing himself. So in asserting that lying is wrong I represent myself as holding a certain con-attitude to lying and set myself up to defend my commitment to that attitude. It is this defensive dimension, and not that they are representational, that Barker thinks essential to assertions. For he thinks all discourse is representational. In ordering you to φ I represent myself as wanting you to φ. The essence of assertion, he claims, is that: "Assertions are democratic; they are a form of stance taking dialogue. Orders are autocratic" (p. 304). That is why assertions are truth-apt and orders are not.

Taken at face value, this certainly seems questionable. Not all orders are issued by drill sergeants. "Come with me to the pictures tonight" is perhaps more naturally described as a request, invitation or suggestion than an order, but a broad grammarian's sense of "order" will cover it, and it is no less certainly not truth-apt than other orders. But it need not be autocratic at all. I'm happy to discuss with you whether it's really such a good idea. And assertions can of course be highly autocratic. "Caesar was victorious at Alesia," bellows the grim Victorian schoolmaster. (Be quiet. Don't argue. Write it down.) He intends no challenge to debate, just an insistence that his audience assimilate his words. But he nonetheless quite incontestably asserts something. So, without further clarification, I remain to be convinced that such considerations can be used to circumscribe the category of assertion in the way Barker supposes.

This is a rewarding collection of papers, abundantly illustrating the lively state of contemporary metaethics. Anyone interested in moral philosophy could very profitably read it.


[1] G. E. Moore: Principia Ethica (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1903)

[2] In focusing on this I follow Nicholas Unwin. See his "Quasi-Realism, Negation and the Frege-Geach Problem" in Philosophical Quarterly 49, 1999, pp. 337-352 and "Norms and Negation: A Problem for Gibbard's Logic" in Philosophical Quarterly 51, 2002. pp. 60-75.