Metametaphysics and the Sciences: Historical and Philosophical Perspectives

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Frode Kjosavik and Camilla Serck-Hanssen (eds.), Metametaphysics and the Sciences: Historical and Philosophical Perspectives, Routledge, 2020, 291pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367263690.

Reviewed by Steven French, University of Leeds


The aim of this collection is to present a set of tools and frameworks that might contribute to the construction of a 'critical' metaphysics, 'shaped by philosophical reflection on science' (p. 1). What sets it apart in the current debate over the extent and impact of such reflection is the set of alternative perspectives on the scope and limits of metaphysics that it offers. In some cases, new ways forward through the debate can be discerned as a result; in others, however, not so much . . .

The volume opens with an essay by one of the co-editors, Frode Kjosavik, whose 'Kant on Method and Evidence in Metaphysics' carefully considers the application of the 'critical method' to the intertwined issues of the scientific legitimacy and role of metaphysics. The result is an erudite and sophisticated interweaving of the historical development of Kant's thought with current metaphysical themes in the context of an appropriately nuanced set of considerations of the nature of metaphysics, mathematics and natural science. Kant's transcendental argument for the possibility of metaphysics is framed in terms of an abductive argument in that it is taken to offer a better explanation than either the rationalist or empiricist accounts. Interestingly, Kjosavik also maps out another abductive route that involves a kind of thought experiment of 'pure reason' in which we consider what sense we can make of things in the theoretical sciences on the basis of the 'Copernican turn' being true -- that is, from the double standpoints of the appearances and of things in themselves -- and compare that to considering those things from only one and the same point of view. Given that the latter leads to the Antinomies, Kant deemed his approach to be the best explanation, with metaphysics understood as the most general attempt to make sense of things (pp. 31-32). This making sense includes accounting for the constitutive conditions and rational constraints of scientific discourse (p. 36) and any metaphysics that does not do that should be dismissed as illegitimate. As Kjosavik concludes, metaphysics needs to make sense of science if it is to make sense of itself.

In similar vein, Houston Smit recalls Kant's dismissal of those forms of metaphysics that consist in 'contriving possibilities merely at will and playing with concepts' (p. 41) and focuses on his claim that 'All true metaphysics is taken from the essence of the capacity of thinking itself' (p. 41). This essence cannot be logical, because then our cognition of it could yield only analytic judgments, whereas metaphysical judgments are synthetic; nor can it be real, because according to Kant we cannot cognize real essences; hence, it must be a formal essence in the sense of the first inner principle of everything that belongs to some, non-real and non-logical, possibility of our capacity of thinking. Smit proposes that this be identified with the 'purely intellectual possibility of our capacity to think' (p. 54) and the rest of the chapter is devoted to supporting and exploring this interpretive move. There is much for Kantian scholars to get their teeth into here, but for those of us who aren't members of that happy tribe, it is hard work picking out transferable insights from this dense and detailed explication.

Another source for Kant's rejection of 'the special metaphysics of the tradition' is examined by the volume's other co-editor, Camilla Serck-Hanssen, in 'From Nothing to Something -- Why Metaphysics Cannot Be Reduced to Logic'. Standardly Kant is understood as rejecting such metaphysics on the basis of the Transcendental Analytic, but she maintains that this is a misreading. Rather, she argues, Kant criticised the advocates of traditional metaphysics on the grounds that they either committed a logical mistake by conflating contradictories with contraries in their use of reductio ad absurdum, or begged the question by taking for granted the existence of the objects to which they claim to refer. For Kant, of course, true existence claims must be grounded in principles established by his transcendental idealism, which constitutes a positive metametaphysics, but his critique stands free of this broader philosophy. Thus Serck-Hanssen's guides our attention to Kant's reflections on negation and the limitations of logic more generally, as well as the need for proper constraints on existence claims.

Toni Kannisto, on the other hand, focuses on the form of transcendental arguments in 'Transcendentally Idealistic Metaphysics and Counterfactual Transcendental Arguments', taking their defining formal characteristic to be the way they 'inversely' infer from a given fact to its enabling conditions. Thus they are taken to be essentially counterfactual in nature and Kannisto formalises the main premise of such an argument as 'necessarily, if q did not hold then p would not hold' (p. 155), invoking Lewis' semantics for counterfactuals. The inference itself is then captured through a 'necessary counterfactual modus tollens', in which the major premise is established via the formal equivalent of going through 'wildly counterfactual thought experiments' (p. 156). Kannisto then argues that this logical structure reveals how tightly bound these kinds of arguments are to our cognitive capacities as it is these that allow us to run through the relevant thought experiments, where 'relevant' here is cashed out in terms of accessible possible worlds. Indeed, he concludes, it is only within the bounds of cognitive accessibility that transcendental arguments can be simultaneously sound, non-superfluous and possess appropriate justificatory force (pp. 162-163). As a result, they must rely on idealism to support their 'strong, metaphysical use' (p. 163).

These two tightly focussed analyses contrast with the broader perspective adopted by Michael Friedman in 'Kant's Metaphysics of Nature and Freedom', which juxtaposes passages from the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science with others from the first, second and third Critiques in order to shed fresh light on the subject of the title. Friedman's claim is that Kant's metaphysics involves no mysterious division into the phenomenal and the noumenal but rather two different standpoints, namely the theoretical and the practical, on the same, phenomenal world. These are 'inextricably connected by a teleological evolutionary conception' (p. 132) that proceeds through three levels: at that of the cosmos we have evolution in accordance with Newtonian physical-mechanical principles, whereas at the level of biological entities, we have evolution via teleological predispositions governing biological characteristics (and here there's an obvious connection to be made with recent work on Kant's views on race), and finally when it comes to human civilisation, we have evolution through moral predispositions that generate the socio-political organisation of human communities. Again, as fascinating as this is from a historical point of view, it is difficult to discern what we are expected to take away from it when it comes to current concerns.

The other figure that features prominently throughout this collection is Husserl. Here, too, a similar question arises: what can those of us not already committed to the phenomenological stance learn from such an approach to metametaphysics?

Christian Beyer's 'Toward a Husserlian (Meta)Metaphysics' goes some way to answering that question by explicitly comparing Husserl's 'transcendental idealism' with Putnam's 'internal realism'. Advocates of the former may well find themselves gritting their teeth over the claim that 'as it stands, Husserl's position is not well-argued and less than convincing' (p. 64), but Beyer puts his finger on a feature of phenomenology that is problematic for many: the requirement that there be an epistemic subject for the 'real possibility' of acquiring empirical knowledge. He proposes to replace this with the 'real higher-order possibility' of an epistemic subject (p. 70), yielding a weaker form of transcendental idealism that may be more appealing but yet retains the 'kernel' of Husserl's position in that what counts as a real possibility of the required sort is still dependent on us. With that move, Beyer then presents a plausible Husserlian alternative to the currently standard metametaphysical picture according to which certain basic objects act as 'referential magnets' that enable us to 'carve out Nature at its joints', to use that objectionably meaty phrase. Instead, we should take the 'objective' world of nature as constituted on the basis of a 'communicative environment' (p. 78) formed by 'relations of mutual understanding' between epistemic subjects in whose consciousnesses objects are fundamentally constituted and acquire sense. Further indications as to how phenomenology can then accommodate the appropriate reflection on science are sketched out in the following pieces.

The role of the relevant community in such an accommodation is also placed centre stage in Mirja Hartimo's 'Husserl on "Besinnung" and Formal Ontology'. In the Logical Investigations Husserl took mathematics as the basis for formal ontology but subsequently concluded that the structuralism inherent in the former was inadequate for grounding the latter (p. 205). In his later Formal and Transcendental Logic, he argued that the ontological commitments of logic could serve in that role, given the focus on truth, understood either via the (phenomenologically conceived) applicability of logic to the world or through a 'transitional link' between the logic of non-contradiction and the logic of truth (p. 207). Crucial to this shift, Hartimo explains, was the 'method of radical Besinnung', through which the normative idea of a given science is made explicit by entering a 'community of empathy' with the relevant scientists (p. 201). Thus the 'intentive sense' of the research becomes clear by paying attention to the relevant practices, rather than relying on apriori intuition or whatever. In her previous work Hartimo has identified some of the members of the mathematical community that Husserl was concerned with, through consideration of the contents of his library, which included works by Hilbert and Weyl (see below). This method also counts as radical insofar as it was concerned with how the goals of these practices were constituted and hence with the very conditions of their possibility (p. 202). Again, here we begin to perceive a way forward that might avoid current dichotomies between 'analytic' and 'naturalistic' approaches.

That such avenues exist and might be usefully explored is also suggested in the paper, 'Phenomenology as Constitutive Realism', by David Woodruff Smith. In the course of a clear if somewhat repetitive overview of the core elements of Husserl's phenomenology, Smith draws on Husserl's own metaphor of a 'zigzag' movement between the world and its constitution in consciousness via ideal meaning structures, to outline a form of phenomenological metametaphysics. These structures can be revealed by adopting the methodology of the 'epoché', that is of bracketing the existence of the world and reflecting on the conditions of the possibility for our conscious intentional experience of things in the world. Just as we move back and forth between our 'everyday' geometry and mathematised geometry (p. 174), so we move between reality and our experienced sense of reality. Thus a tree, for example, 'is constituted through an indefinitely large manifold of meanings correlated with how the same tree is presented from many different perspectives' (p. 191). So much for trees, what about electrons? Husserl's answer was to insist that our judgments regarding physics are founded on our judgments in everyday life and to distinguish, as a result, two levels of epoché (pp. 192-193): first we bracket the properties of things like electrons, leaving still our experience of 'everyday' things and then we bracket the properties of the latter. The meaning structures underpinning our judgments of the everyday then provide the logical and semantic support for the relevant meaning structures of the judgments formed in the practice of physics.

The accommodation of physics within the phenomenological stance is pursued further by Thomas Ryckman in 'Symbolic Construction from the "Purely Infinitesimal": Gauge Invariance, Lie Algebras, and Metaphysics chez Hermann Weyl'. Weyl (mentioned in Hartimo's piece), was of course one of the most influential mathematicians of recent times and was introduced to phenomenology by his wife, Helene, a student of Husserl's. Ryckman's excavation of the phenomenological ground of Weyl's work in mathematical physics is well-known and here Ryckman outlines how 'a non-naturalistic metaphysics of transcendental subjectivity proved an extremely fruitful heuristic in two of Weyl's central achievements' (p. 255), namely the development of Lie algebras and the origin of the idea of gauge invariance, both of which have assumed a central importance in modern physics. Ryckman's aim here is to offer an alternative to the 'current naturalistic monoculture' (p. 255): rather than simply being shaped by reflection on science, Weyl's phenomenological focus on the infinitesimally small -- where we find the remnant of a situated consciousness in terms of which reality is constituted -- generated new science. Still, a fully formed phenomenological metaphysics of science remains elusive and for those of us who are not yet converts to the phenomenological cause, Husserl seems to offer us not so much a toolbox, from which we can pick and choose useful devices, but something comparable to an entirely new workshop, with tools devised for a different set of needs.

The other contributions to this collection are more disparate in both content and style.

Leila Haaparanta's 'Frege on "Es gibt", Being in a Realm and (Meta)Ontology' draws on her previous work on Frege's analysis of the concept of being. Here she relates two seemingly disparate positions that Frege held: that being or existence is not a real first-order property and that we can distinguish three realms -- that of objective and actual objects, that of subjective ideas and that of objective yet abstract entities such as numbers and thoughts -- whose inhabitants seem to have that very property. Her core claim is that 'the concept of existence that is expressed as a second-order concept in the formula language plays an important logical role, while the doctrine of three realms is a means to express a division between three modes of being or three ways to exist.' (p. 82) As a first order predicate being is empty, but becomes meaningful when understood as the predicate of belonging to one or other of the three realms. An entity's mode of being is not captured via the conceptual notation but is a matter of ontology. In this respect, Haaparanta suggests, even if one were to agree that Frege was not a metaphysician, it should be acknowledged that he was following in the metaphysical footsteps of Aristotle and Kant.

Charles Parson's 'Quine on Truth and Metaphysics' is a bit of a mixed bag in itself. It begins, as the title suggests, with Quine on truth, regarded as immanent in disquotational contexts but as transcendent when the truth predicate is carried over to other languages by translation (p. 226), thereby offering a comparison with Davidson. Parsons then asks, 'Was Quine a metaphysician?' (p. 226). On the one hand, his naturalism appeared to go hand in hand with an acceptance of fundamentality, so that in 'Whither Physical Objects?' he takes quantum mechanics to imply the elimination of such objects, as typically conceived, leaving us only with space-time points as the fundamental 'simples', in today's terminology. On the other, Parsons insists, ontological relativity implies that 'We can't be what Hilary Putnam calls metaphysical realists' (p. 228). The essay concludes with a final question, 'What would Quine think of today's analytical metaphysics?' (p. 228). The obvious answer that Parsons explores using the example of Sider's work, Four-Dimensionalism, is that he certainly would have thought that it isn't naturalistic enough! And the emphasis on macroscopic, 'everyday' objects that characterises much of current 'analytic' metaphysics, rather than the findings of modern science, would also have left Quine unmoved. But then, perhaps metaphysical reflection on the former can help shape devices that can be used as tools to help us understand the latter.

Øystein Linnebo in 'The Paradox of the Largest Number: From Aristotle to Cantor' argues that the paradox in the title -- that because we can always add to the largest number we can think of, there can be no largest number and yet if we add one more thing to an infinite number of things there are still infinitely many, so infinity must be the largest number -- should not be dismissed as a childish illusion. Careful reflection on the paradox, in particular in its historical context, 'forces us to rethink the relation between mathematics and modality, especially the metaphysics of modality' (p. 236). What does the work in this rethinking is the Aristotelian notion of 'potential infinity', retrieved and polished up by Linnebo and deployed to resolve the paradox in the form of the 'absolute infinite'. Whereas each finite and transfinite number is a determinate measure of the cardinality of certain pluralities, absolute infinity isn't a determinate measure at all but is rather a property of some type of object, namely, 'the property that no determinate measure is large enough to provide an upper bound on the cardinality of every possible plurality of objects of this type.' (p. 248). Absolute infinity is absolute precisely because it is ascribed to 'conceptually individuated collections that are "spread out" across the modal or generative dimension.' (p. 251). Interesting stuff, of course, but quite what it has to do with the rest of the collection is hard to discern.

Finally, I'm afraid that I have no idea what to make of Joseph Olmog's and Olli Koistinen's 'Thinking-the-World', which seeks to unify the scientific, philosophical and theological ways of 'thinking-the-world' but comes across as something of a parody with its talk of 'island beings' and how 'Even detached islands -- e.g., the Galapagos -- can develop no coherent sense of their own individual islandhood without experiencing, cognizing and re-cognizing the surrounding ocean that is one's maker and sustainer.' (p. 103). Sadly, any potentially interesting insights on Kant's view of the infinite as it pertains to both space and God are buried under this teeth-clenching presentation.

To sum up: this is definitely a mixed bag, as so many such collections are. However, if you're interested in a Kantian or phenomenological take on metaphysics and its relationship to science and mathematics, there are certainly useful insights to be gained, albeit, perhaps, only after some excavation.