Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology

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David Chalmers, David Manley, and Ryan Wasserman (eds.), Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology, Oxford UP, 2009, 529pp., $45.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199546008.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Barnes, University of Leeds



The main goal of a favorable book review should be to make people who read the review want to read the book. With that in mind, this review of Metametaphysics won’t be addressed to those deeply immersed in contemporary metaphysics (you know who you are). Rather, I’ll try to show that even if you’re not a metaphysician indeed, even if you’re deeply suspicious of metaphysics Metametaphysics is interesting.

Selling Metametaphysics to people who don’t really like first-order metaphysics isn’t easy. A non-metaphysician colleague of mine recently remarked, in a discussion about the volume, that ‘it really tells you something about the status of metaphysics, doesn’t it?’ Given that metaphysics only returned to the philosophical mainstream in the latter decades of the 20th century (after long years on the post-positivist sidelines), metaphysics seems to have ‘gone meta’ far more quickly than other disciplines. Moreover, it seems to have ‘gone meta’ largely in order to defend itself as a worthwhile discipline. That it has had to launch such carefully mounted defenses of itself and resort to meta-commentary analyzing its own nature as a discipline were to this colleague yet further evidence that there’s something suspicious about metaphysics. He maintained that practicing metaphysicians who want the discipline to be taken seriously should find a volume like Metametaphysics cause for concern rather than for celebration. Non-metaphysicians can simply dismiss it as another reason to look askance at metaphysics.

Suspicion about metaphysics isn’t uncommon, and it isn’t new. Metaphysicians obsess about abstract and technical debates, carried out in esoteric terms only used by (and perhaps only comprehensible to) other metaphysicians. If you ask non-metaphysicians about metaphysics, they will more than likely be inclined to shrug and say ’what’s the point?’ (and that’s if they are being polite). If metaphysics is a robust enterprise, trying to describe the nature of objective reality, then surely its questions are better answered by physicists. If it’s a more modest enterprise, trying to describe our concepts, then surely its questions are better answered by philosophers of language and philosophers of mind. If it’s a domain where multiple answers are on equally good footing and the disputes are merely verbal, then surely its questions are better left unasked.

That the questions asked by metaphysicians should simply be left to physicists is not a criticism that those not generally skeptical of philosophical inquiry should take seriously. As philosophers, we tend to value the methodology of our own discipline and (whether justified or not) think that this methodology can make uniquely valuable contributions. Philosophy of language should not be abandoned for linguistics, aesthetics should not be abandoned for art criticism and art history, philosophy of mind should not be abandoned for psychology and cognitive science, and so on. There are often more empirical disciplines concerned with the same subject matter, but that doesn’t mean the philosophy is in bad standing. Or so say the philosophers, anyway.

But that metaphysics is at best a conceptual project (even if it thinks of itself as an inquiry into objective, ‘fundamental’ reality) and at worst a badly-formed language game is a criticism that philosophers can bring against metaphysics without undermining their own sub-disciplines. Further, it’s a criticism which should, and often does, worry those working in metaphysics.

The project of ‘metametaphysics’ is often thought to be aimed at these very criticisms. ‘Metametaphysics’ is metaphysicians trying to defend the legitimacy of their own discipline. This is where my colleague’s worry arises. What other subfield of philosophy has to try so hard to defend itself? The very existence of ‘metametaphysics’, and a volume like Metametaphysics, shows just how precarious a position metaphysics stands in.

So is the publication of a book like Metametaphysics yet further evidence that there’s something philosophically queasy about metaphysics? Not obviously. To fully understand why, however, you really need to read Metametaphysics.

Compare metametaphysics to that other famous ‘meta’ discipline metaethics. Arguably, ethics as a whole couldn’t be the same after Mackie. Once someone clearly articulated the idea that our moralizing (while useful) rests on a mistake, and that our moral claims were all false, a question loomed over most any first-order normative debate: is this all just nonsense? But metaethics didn’t then simply divide itself into moral skeptics on one side (yes, it’s nonsense!) and moral realists on the other (no, real objective moral truth is out there!). There are multiple gradations of metaethical positions between Mackie and Moore (emotivists, projectivists, relativists, contextualists, etc). Moreover, metaethics extends far beyond such debates. It includes discussion of what normativity is like, how normative inquiry should be undertaken, and so on.

Metametaphysics is, in many respects, a similar field. Metaphysics can’t be the same after Ayer and Carnap. Once the suspicion is raised that your discipline is really nonsense, you can think that suspicion is wrong, and you can argue against it, but you can’t ignore it. But as the pages of Metametaphysics show, the ensuing debate is not simply a matter of ‘skeptics vs. true believers’. Being skeptical about metaphysics is much more complicated than simply saying ‘oh, that sounds like nonsense’. Moreover, there’s much more to metametaphysics than a dialogue between those who like metaphysics and those who don’t. There are questions of how metaphysics should be done, what kinds of questions it should include, and so on.

On a brief guided tour of Metametaphysics, though, skepticism about metaphysics is a good place to start.1 Though skepticism about metaphysics is common, when pressed it’s often unclear what this skepticism amounts to. Verificationist-based skepticism about metaphysics was easy to espouse when positivism dominated. Now that positivism is mostly a footnote in philosophical history, the skeptics have to try a little harder. As sections of Metametaphysics point out, however, appropriately articulating what skepticism about metaphysics involves proves difficult. John Hawthorne outlines the problems in developing a skepticism about metaphysics that is both stable and plausible. In a similar vein, Theodore Sider carefully specifies what the metaphysical skeptic must commit to, and then argues that the metaphysician can and should resist these commitments. It’s not as easy to be skeptical about metaphysics (while not being skeptical about all philosophy) as many philosophers assume.

Even if you’re convinced that no defense of metaphysics could ever be adequate, you’ll likely still find something of interest in Metametaphysics, since it contains perhaps the most compelling articulation, to date, of the idea that abstract metaphysical debates are insubstantial or ‘merely verbal’: Eli Hirsch’s Neo-Carnapian theory of quantifier variance. Consider the debate between the compositional universalist (who says that every collection of objects composes a further complex object) and the compositional nihilist (who says that there are no complex objects). Then consider an entire linguistic community which speaks like the nihilist, and one which speaks like the universalist. Each community’s ontological claims are, according to Hirsch, true in their own language. This shows that the debate between the nihilist and the universalist is merely verbal and a merely verbal debate gets us nowhere and so might as well be given up. (Though it’s important to note that Hirsch thinks this form of skepticism applies only to cases where the statements on one side of a debate have equivalent counterparts on the other side of the debate.)

But skepticism about metaphysics is not limited to neo-Carnapianism. Metametaphysics usefully distinguishes numerous gradations of skepticism and deflationism about metaphysics. David Chalmers and Stephen Yablo, for example, each think that some metaphysics is in good standing and unproblematic. They both take issue, however, with some of the more abstract debates in first-order ontology, arguing that the existence-questions these debates pose may have no determinate answer. Yablo locates the problem in the semantics of the debates’ referring terms, whereas Chalmers points the finger at its quantifiers, but both agree there is something defective about the discourse that makes many of its core postulates indeterminate, and thus its central questions unanswerable.

Whether talk of determinacy and lack thereof is the best way to characterize skepticism about such ontological disputes is questionable. Some philosophers (this reviewer included) think that metaphysical indeterminacy is at least coherent, and thus could make sense of the thought that some existence questions don’t have determinate answers without thinking this shows anything problematic about those questions themselves. That point aside, however, Chalmers and Yablo both present an interesting ‘middle ground’ form of skepticism: not dismissive of metaphysics as a whole, but dubious of some of its more rarefied ontological debates. Whether this form of skepticism is stable that is, whether one can continue to do some metaphysics non-skeptically while being highly skeptical about the question of what ‘fundamentally exists’ is an important question for metaphysics.

Yet another form of skepticism in Metametaphysics is that presented by Karen Bennett. Bennett agrees that we should be skeptical about some debates in metaphysics, but argues for a different form of skepticism than the familiar ‘metaphysicians are talking past each other’ or ‘these questions don’t really have answers’. Bennett construes abstract ontological debates as well-formed, in good philosophical standing, and as having answers (answers which are determined by how the world is, not by what our conceptual scheme is like). But, in certain paradigm cases, she doesn’t think we’ll ever be able to figure out what those answers are. The problem with these ontological disputes, according to Bennett, is that we’re simply unable to decide between what seem to us, anyway to be equally good rival theories, and no amount of further theorizing will help us decide. The questions we’re asking in metaphysics or at least parts of metaphysics aren’t the sort of questions to which the methodology of metaphysics will ever provide answers. This is skepticism not about the good philosophical standing of metaphysics, but rather about our ability to make progress in it.

One way of avoiding skepticism in whatever form it comes about metaphysics is to be revisionist about metaphysics. This is the approach taken by Amie Thomasson. Thomasson argues that the skeptical problem arises when metaphysicians attempt to use ontological terms like ‘thing’ in a theory-neutral way, stripped of all ‘application conditions’. They do this in an attempt to avoid talking past each other, but they end up asking meaningless ontological questions. Yet there are many ontological questions which are not like this: whether that is a table, whether this is a tree, etc. To answer these questions, we simply need to engage in a two-step process first, conceptual analysis to determine the application condition of our sortal terms (‘table’, ‘tree’, etc), and second, empirical inquiry as to whether those conditions are met. This type of conceptual investigation rather than rarefied technical discussions about ontology should be the task of metaphysics. Metaphysics is perhaps still, on this construal, open to other forms of criticism that might be classed as skepticism about metaphysics that metaphysical questions are at best better left to the philosopher of language, and at worst simply uninteresting, can still trouble this more conceptual picture of metaphysics. Nevertheless Thomasson articulates an interesting alternative picture of the methodology and aims of metaphysics.

Those in favor of more traditional metaphysics can look to Sider, who defends abstract ontological debates from the kind of skepticism espoused by Hirsch. By appealing to a notion of ontological structure, Sider argues that metaphysicians can show how their debates are in good standing. Realism about structure ‘joints in nature’, to quote the familiar metaphor enables metaphysicians to appropriately ground their theories, ensuring that they do not merely talk past their opponents in debates about metaphysics.

As should be clear, Metametaphysics hosts a debate that is much more nuanced than a simple ‘skeptics vs. enthusiasts’ dichotomy. Skepticism about metaphysics can take different forms and come in different degrees. It is also, unsurprisingly, resistable in a variety of ways. Metametaphysics develops many of the central issues in this dialectic, making it essential reading, not just for the metaphysician, but for the skeptic about metaphysics as well.

It’s also important to note that Metametaphysics covers far more than skepticism about metaphysics and responses to such skepticism. Many of its papers are devoted to, inter alia, how we should understand the basic project of metaphysics, how metaphysical questions can be answered, and what kinds of questions should be included in legitimate metaphysical debates.

Jonathan Schaffer, Kit Fine, and Sider each give explanations of how basic ontological inquiry should be understood. Schaffer appeals to a notion of ontological priority, Fine to a distinction between what exists and what exists ‘in reality’, and Sider to ontological structure. Each of these represent alternative ways of characterizing the basic but often opaque ontological question of what is ‘fundamental’.

Bob Hale and Crispin Wright undertake the metametaphysics of their NeoFregean philosophy of mathematics. They argue that, suitably construed, questions such as ‘are there any numbers?’ have easy and straightforward answers. On their construal, once you understand that certain basic principles (such as ’Hume’s Principle’: the number of Fs = the number of Gs iff there is a one to one correspondence between the Fs and the Gs), gain some empirical information (there is a one to one correspondence between the Fs and the Gs), and reflect a little on how reference works, the existence of numbers falls out straightforwardly no need for ontological hand-wringing or deep background metaphysics.

Kris McDaniel focuses on rehabilitating a kind of metaphysical question that has been in general disrepute since the early 20th century. Metaphysics should include, according to McDaniel, not just the question of whether a thing exists, but also the question of what way a thing exists. He argues for the coherence of ‘ways of being’ a resurrection of the historically popular idea that ‘being’ is not univocal. For example, if there are both abstracta and concreta, it could be a different thing entirely for something to exist abstractly than it is for something to exist concretely.

This is a very brief and very incomplete sampling of Metametaphysics. The central point is simply that there’s much more to the volume than metaphysicians saying ‘trust us, it really is okay to do metaphysics’. There’s much value in it, not just for the metaphysician, but also for the person skeptical about metaphysics (but trying to solidify that skepticism, or figure out what exactly those metaphysicians are up to). And it shouldn’t make you worry about metaphysics at least not more than you already do.

1 NB: I am using the term ‘skepticism’ more loosely than it’s used in parts of Metametaphysics. In the volume, a distinction is drawn between skeptics (who think metaphysics asks questions we can’t answer) and deflationists (who think the questions are somehow defective). My use of ‘skepticism’ is meant to include those who are generally skeptical about metaphysics, and deflationists fall into this category. If you don’t like my use of ‘skepticism’ you can replace it with ‘suspicion’.