Metaphysical Emergence

Metaphysical Emergence

Jessica M. Wilson, Metaphysical Emergence, Oxford University Press, 2021, 336pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198823742.

Reviewed by Alyssa Ney, University of California, Davis


Despite its wide-ranging discussion of subjects from complexity science and nonlinear systems to the hard problem of consciousness and free will, Jessica Wilson’s first monograph is a coherent, clear, and tightly-argued defense of her approach to the topic. In a series of papers starting in 1999, Wilson has defended a rightly influential account of what she deems to be one species of metaphysical emergence, weak emergence, based on a causal powers metaphysics. In this book, she argues that there are really only two senses in which phenomena may be metaphysically emergent. They may be emergent in her weak sense, which is compatible with physicalism, or another strong sense, which is not. The first part of this book consists in an argument that these are the only two accounts of emergence that are viable and coherent. The second part applies these accounts to determine whether it is plausible that any phenomena actually are metaphysically emergent in either of these senses. The short answer is that yes, there is plausibly a lot of what Wilson calls weak metaphysical emergence at our world. The reality of strong emergence is a bit more controversial, but the most plausible instances of it come, in Wilson’s view, from libertarian free will.

Most of my discussion in what follows will concern the first part of the book, in which Wilson proposes an exhaustive taxonomy of the varieties of metaphysical emergence. According to Wilson, assuming a metaphysics in which the base-level entities are all physical, views that say some phenomenon is metaphysically emergent may either be consistent with physicalism, or not consistent with physicalism. If they are consistent with physicalism, then they will be weakly emergent. If they are not consistent with physicalism, then they will be strongly emergent. Since these options are exhaustive, if Wilson is successful, then any philosophical or scientific claim that some phenomenon is metaphysically emergent must, to be correct, fit into some place in Wilson’s taxonomy, being metaphysically emergent in either her weak or strong sense. In what follows, I will express skepticism that Wilson’s two options are truly exhaustive. I will also question whether Wilson’s account of weak emergence provides a sufficient condition for a version of metaphysical emergence. However, let’s first see how Wilson understands these varieties of metaphysical emergence.

Wilson argues that any account of metaphysical emergence, worthy of the name, must hold that some phenomenon is “cotemporally dependent” on some (material) base phenomena, and yet ontologically and causally autonomous with respect to those base phenomena. The emergence is thus metaphysical because it depends on the existence of such objective relations between the emergent phenomenon and its base; and not, for example, merely on how we think about or what we can know about these phenomena. Wilson’s requirement of cotemporal material dependence is meant to capture the sense in which emergent phenomena somehow arise from a physical base, whether that be by some sort of synchronic metaphysical determination or some causal activity of the base that takes place over a temporal interval. The sense of ontological and causal autonomy at issue will depend on the kind of metaphysical emergence involved. As mentioned, Wilson argues there are exactly two kinds of metaphysical emergence, weak and strong. The weak version is intended to characterize a non-epiphenomenalist nonreductive physicalism, and its official formulation is:

Weak emergence: What it is for token feature S to be Weakly metaphysically emergent from token feature P on a given occasion is for it to be the case, on that occasion, (i) that S cotemporally materially depends on P, and (ii) that S has a non-empty proper subset of the token powers had by P. (72)

The strong version is intended to be incompatible with both epiphenomenalism and physicalism:

Strong emergence: What it is for token feature S to be Strongly metaphysically emergent from token feature P on a given occasion is for it to be the case, on that occasion, (i) that S cotemporally materially depends on P, and (ii) that S has at least one token power not identical with any token power of P. (53)

The difference between Wilson’s weak and strong emergence is in how causal autonomy is achieved. In the case of weak emergence, it is because the emergent phenomenon has only a subset of the causal powers of its material base. In the case of strong emergence, it is because the emergent phenomenon has all of the causal powers of its material base and more.

Wilson makes an intuitive case that these options are exhaustive. The language she uses is that her accounts of weak and strong emergence are “core and crucial” to the phenomena of metaphysical emergence. Attention to these options:

makes clear the limited ways in which a cotemporally materially dependent higher-level feature can be causally, hence ontologically, autonomous with respect to its base feature, as the operative conception of metaphysical emergence requires. First, the feature may have more powers than its base feature; second, the feature may have fewer powers than its base feature. In terms of effects: the higher-level feature may be distinctively efficacious in its potentially contributing to causing more effects than its base feature, or it may be distinctively efficacious in potentially contributing to fewer effects than its base feature. Since complete coincidence of token powers doesn’t make room for causal autonomy (distinctive efficacy), these routes to metaphysical emergence exhaust the available options. (74)

One concern with this way of arguing for the exhaustiveness of the options is that it leaves out another possibility: namely that the emergent phenomenon has strictly diverse powers than its material base: not necessarily fewer causal powers, but not necessarily more either, just different causal powers. In both of the cases allowed for in the argument above, the causal powers of an emergent phenomenon and its base partially overlap and so at least some, if not all, powers of the emergent phenomena are physical. But there seems to be a coherent sense of robust metaphysical emergence in which the emergent is not physical at all and so neither are any of its causal powers the powers of the material base. At least it is not clear why this is not a coherent view that would be aptly labeled “strong emergence.” So far as I can tell, this other option is compatible with Wilson’s official account of strong emergence. It just escapes this argument for the exhaustiveness of the options.

Another (not unrelated) concern with Wilson’s claim that her accounts are exhaustive is that many philosophers, particularly philosophers of physics, will be uncomfortable with the causal powers framework in which Wilson’s options are couched. Why, one might ask, can’t one have a nonreductive and non-epiphenomenalist version of physicalism according to which (a) special science phenomena are realized by physical phenomena and (b) the former’s distinctive causal efficacy is just revealed by the truth of certain counterfactuals? I’m thinking especially of Barry Loewer (2007) who argues that distinctive causal efficacy for special science phenomena may be achieved without requiring any way of identifying the causal powers of special science phenomena with that of their base features. Indeed philosophers of physics have generally been skeptical that fundamental physics licenses the application of causal concepts. So why does the causal autonomy of emergent phenomena have to be accounted for in terms of the overlapping of causal powers? To be fair, Wilson claims to be adopting a fairly loose conception of ‘causal powers.’ She says that talk “of powers is simply shorthand for talk of what causal contributions possession of a given feature makes (or can make, relative to the same laws of nature) to an entity’s bringing about an effect” (32) and that even a Humean (like Loewer, for example) can accept her notion of powers: “for such a Humean, to say that an (ultimately categorical) feature has a certain power would be to say that, were a token of the feature to occur in certain circumstances, a certain (contingent) regularity would be instanced” (33).

Maybe it is right that we can paraphrase contentious-sounding talk of causal powers with statements about counterfactuals and laws. However, I feel the hunch that the argument for the exhaustiveness of the account really seems to rely on our making sense of the overlapping of physical and mental token causal powers. And it is not quite clear how one would go about paraphrasing the official formulations of Weak and Strong emergence (particularly their second clauses) into statements just involving counterfactual and laws. And then it is not clear we would find a persuasive argument that the two views we are left with are clearly exhaustive.

I was also not sure about how the very influential account of emergence proposed by Jeremy Butterfield (2011) fits into Wilson’s taxonomy. Butterfield’s is arguably a kind of weak emergence (since it is explicitly built to be compatible with reduction). According to Butterfield, emergent phenomena are reducible in the sense of being deducible from a physical theory when some limit is taken, e.g., in the case of thermodynamics, when the number of constituent particles N goes to ∞. In actual systems, this limit is not reached, and yet the behaviors deducible at the limit occur. According to Butterfield’s account then, there is a sense in which emergent phenomena involve causal behaviors that go beyond what is described by the base physical theory. It thus would seem to count as a kind of strong emergence, according to Wilson’s taxonomy. And yet, since the behaviors in question are physical behaviors (at least in the sense of being characterizable by a physical base theory as the behaviors of systems at the limit N=∞), it seems wrong to say this is a kind of emergence that is not compatible with physicalism. So thoughts like this have me a bit skeptical that all that has legitimately been called ‘metaphysical emergence’ by philosophers falls under one of the two options Wilson delineates.

I am also skeptical that satisfaction of her schema for weak emergence is sufficient for something that is fruitfully thought of as metaphysical emergence. As I argued in previous work (2010) and as Jaegwon Kim (2010) has also argued, on a properties-as-causal-powers view like that of Sydney Shoemaker (2007), satisfaction of the weak emergence schema yields a metaphysics that seems neither nonreductive nor emergentist in any metaphysical sense. According to Shoemaker, properties are individuated by reference to causal powers. When Wilson’s weak emergence is satisfied, the special science property is individuated by reference to only a subset of its base’s causal powers. Yet all of the powers relevant to individuating the special science properties are microphysical. So it is difficult to understand how one who adopts this anti-quidditistic causal powers theory of properties can say there is metaphysically anything there beyond microphysical causal powers.

In the book, Wilson dismisses my concern as assuming an anti-realism about special science properties. She says that rather than being anti-realist about special science properties, a better methodological attitude takes them at face value (78). But my point was not that we should deny that on this view there are special science properties. My point (and Kim’s as well) was only that once we have a view that takes special science properties to be individuated by their causal powers, and all of the causal powers in question are microphysical causal powers, it is hard to see how the special science properties are not, metaphysically-speaking, reducible to something microphysical. So, a claim of nonreductionism or metaphysical emergentism seems mistaken.

I have so far not said much about the second part of the book, in which Wilson applies her taxonomy. What Wilson does in this part is painstakingly apply her accounts of weak and strong emergence developed in the first part to the task of addressing claims about the metaphysical emergence of (i) complex systems, (ii) ordinary objects like artifacts, (iii) consciousness, and (iv) free will. These chapters do a beautiful job of demonstrating the fruitfulness of Wilson’s framework for conceptualizing metaphysical emergence. They breathe new life into many of these debates and provide a rigorous way to assess the emergence claims of both scientists and philosophers. These chapters also provide a showcase of Wilson’s prolific and ingenious work across subdisciplines of philosophy and how this work may be put to use in addressing questions about the emergence of various phenomena. I will just mention three examples. Wilson’s discussion of complex systems demonstrates how her earlier (2010) account of material dependence in terms of elimination of degrees of freedom can make claims of weak and strong emergence easier to evaluate. Her discussion of the emergence of ordinary objects utilizes her very influential (2013) account of metaphysical indeterminacy to show how vagueness in the boundaries of ordinary objects might underwrite a defense of their being weakly emergent. And finally, her discussion of the conceivability (zombie) argument and its lessons for the viability of strong emergence showcases her (2019) work with Stephen Biggs, and how it can give us a better handle on whether zombies are truly possible.

In case it is not already clear from what has been said so far, this book is a staggeringly impressive work of a philosopher at the very top of her game. Its main significance will be in providing an authoritative and comprehensive conceptual framework for metaphysical emergence that should be used to formulate claims of emergence across science and philosophy going forward. This remains the case even if the taxonomy turns out not to be exhaustive. This book should also be essential reading for those engaged with specific debates about the metaphysical emergence of complex systems, ordinary objects, consciousness, and free will. Wilson’s book lays new conceptual foundations that provide hope for progress in all of these debates.


Biggs, Stephen and Jessica Wilson. 2019. Abduction versus Conceiving in the Epistemology of Modality. Synthese. Online first.

Butterfield, Jeremy. 2011. Less is Different: Emergence and Reduction Reconciled. Foundations of Physics. 41(6): 1065–1135.

Kim, Jaegwon. 2010. Thoughts on Sydney Shoemaker’s Physical Realization. Philosophical Studies. 148(1): 101–112.

Loewer, Barry. 2007. Mental Causation, Or Something Near Enough. In Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Mind. B.P. McLaughlin and J.D. Cohen, eds. Oxford: Blackwell, 243–264.

Ney, Alyssa. 2010. Convergence on the Problem of Mental Causation: Shoemaker’s Strategy for (Nonreductive?) Physicalists. Philosophical Issues. 20(1): 438–445.

Shoemaker, Sydney. 2010. Physical Realization. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wilson, Jessica. 1999. How Superduper Does a Physicalist Supervenience Need to Be? The Philosophical Quarterly. 49: 33–52.

Wilson, Jessica. 2010. Non-reductive Physicalism and Degrees of Freedom. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science. 61: 279–311.

Wilson, Jessica. 2013. A Determinable-based Account of Metaphysical Indeterminacy. Inquiry. 56: 359–385.