Metaphysical Essays

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John Hawthorne, Metaphysical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2006, 299pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199291241.

Reviewed by E. J. Lowe, University of Durham


This is a collection of sixteen of John Hawthorne's recent essays on topics in contemporary analytic metaphysics, six of which are new to this volume. The six new essays are 'Plenitude, Convention, and Ontology', 'Three-Dimensionalism', 'Motion and Plenitude', 'Quantity in Lewisian Metaphysics', 'Determinism De Re', and 'What Would Teleological Causation Be?' (the last co-authored with Daniel Nolan). The remaining ten essays, none of which was previously published earlier than 2000, are 'Identity', 'Locations' (with Theodore Sider), 'Recombination, Causal Constraints, and Humean Supervenience: An Argument for Temporal Parts?' (with Ryan Wasserman and Mark Scala), 'Gunk and Continuous Variation' (with Frank Arntzenius), 'Vagueness and the Mind of God', 'Epistemicism and Semantic Plasticity', 'Causal Structuralism', 'Why Humeans Are Out of Their Minds', 'Chance and Counterfactuals', and 'Before-Effect and Zeno Causality'. As the titles of the essays suggest, and as Hawthorne acknowledges in the volume's brief introduction, David Lewis's work is a pervasive theme throughout the book and references to him in the index outnumber by far references to any other author. (The next two most cited authors are Timothy Williamson and Theodore Sider.) Many of the essays engage explicitly with Lewis's work and almost all are on topics that have a direct bearing on the Lewisian corpus. Hawthorne's conception of metaphysics and way of pursuing it also seem, to this reviewer at least, distinctly Lewisian in flavour. There is the same close attention to detail, care and clarity of expression, deft and assured appeal to logico-mathematical considerations and techniques, adept deployment for ontological purposes of the apparatus of set theory and mereology, sophisticated sensitivity to issues in philosophical semantics, respect for the theories of physical science, and relentless pursuit of rigorous argument.

In one regard especially, however, Hawthorne's metaphysics differ importantly from Lewis's. As Hawthorne himself acknowledges, he has no 'grand underlying vision: a comprehensive metaphysical system would be nice, but I don't have one to offer' (p. vii). Perhaps this is true, rather unsurprisingly, of most metaphysicians working in the shadow of Lewis -- and that, of course, means the vast majority of contemporary metaphysicians. Lewis himself obviously had a comprehensive system and in terms of that system he set the agenda for a whole generation of younger metaphysicians, as a glance at any recent issue of a general philosophy journal in the analytic tradition reveals. It is perfectly understandable, then, that so much contemporary work in metaphysics either operates within some part of the Lewisian system or else opposes it in a piecemeal fashion, but still in a distinctly Lewisian style and without offering a countervailing 'grand underlying vision'. There are, of course, notable exceptions, to be found in the work, for instance, of David Armstrong and Peter van Inwagen, both of whom have inspired a good many followers, but it is not a gross exaggeration to say that contemporary metaphysics just is, for the most part, metaphysics à la Lewis. It is this kind of metaphysics, then, that the readers of Hawthorne's book should be prepared to find throughout its pages. And what they will be rewarded with, if they persevere with the intricacies of Hawthorne's arguments, is a virtuoso display of Lewis-style metaphysical reasoning of the very highest order. Hawthorne remarks, at the end of his Introduction, that '[Lewis's] work was the benchmark of quality, his approval the sure sign of having done a good thing. Doing metaphysics in his absence is quite an adjustment' (p. x). In another possible world more fortunate than ours, in which Lewis's counterpart survives to read a counterpart of the present volume of essays, Hawthorne's counterpart assuredly receives the wished-for sign of approval. And in this, the actual world, Hawthorne himself has clearly adjusted admirably well to Lewis's absence.

It is not possible, in the short space available for a review of this kind, to enter into serious critical engagement with much of what Hawthorne has to say in this volume. The complexity of the arguments that he advances would render any such attempt hopelessly superficial. Furthermore, there is no real unity to the volume -- no big underlying thesis whose credentials could be examined. There is not even any very obvious reason for the order in which the essays in it are presented, beyond the fact that some that are grouped together have related themes. The reason for publishing them as a collection was, presumably, just to make them more conveniently available for the many philosophers and students who will need to consult them -- and that, certainly, was an excellent reason. The most that we are given, in the Introduction, as a guide to the collection is Hawthorne's identification of three general themes that inform various of the essays, namely, 'plenitude', 'natural properties and microphysics', and 'stage primacy'. The second theme can perhaps be allowed to speak for itself, but the others need a little explication. By 'plenitude', Hawthorne intends the doctrine, which he supports, that 'we should supplement the ontology of common sense with a range of additional objects whose existence we recognize on grounds of parity' (p. vii). I shall return to this in a moment. By 'stage primacy', he means the doctrine, which he resists, that 'instantaneous, point-sized temporal parts -- "stages" of point particles -- are the fundamental material beings' (p. ix). In opposition to the latter doctrine, he examines the merits of 'a "gunky" rather than "pointillist" picture of matter and space-time' (p. ix), while also contending that even if the 'gunky' picture is rejected, the 'pointillist' picture is not the only viable alternative. Interesting though these technical debates are, which draw upon an appreciation of subtle and controversial issues in measure theory and continuum mathematics, the ordinary philosopher might be excused for wondering whether they don't intrude too far upon proper terrain of mathematical physics, whose contemporary practitioners, I suppose, might look upon these discussions with the same puzzlement as they might display in perusing the pages of some six-hundred-year-old Scholastic treatise on Aristotle's physics.

The doctrine of plenitude does at least connect with common-sense ontology, if only to pronounce its inadequacy. Hawthorne gives a neat example of how plenitudinous thinking operates. À propos of Eli Hirsch's notorious positing of 'in-cars' and 'out-cars' -- 'objects that grow and shrink as a car leaves its garage' (p. vii) -- Hawthorne observes:

But we don't think it ridiculous that there are objects that grow and shrink as large rocks move underwater, where the size of the object corresponds to the portion of the rock above the surface of the water: we call such objects 'islands'. It seems clear that none but the most insular [sic] metaphysician should countenance islands while repudiating incars; none but the most radical should renounce both. Instead, we should supplement the ontology of common sense with a range of additional objects whose existence we recognize on grounds of parity. (p. vii)

Consider the Isle of Wight -- a fairly large island situated off the southern coast of England. No doubt most people will say that its dimensions have changed over time as the sea-level has changed and as processes of erosion by wind and water have taken their toll. But what, exactly, do we -- or, more to the point, should we -- take this 'common-sense' object to be? To answer that question, we need at least to find a perspicuous account of its identity-conditions and, by implication, the identity-conditions of all objects of the same putative kind. What kind is that? The obvious answer is: island. But is that a genuine kind, imposing well-defined identity-conditions on its individual members? A little reflection suggests that the correct answer is probably 'No'.

Suppose, for example, that in the future the sea-level rises so much that Mount Everest is separated by water from the neighbouring Himalayan peaks. Would Mount Everest have ceased to exist in those circumstances? Surely not -- and yet it would now be an 'island'. What we call an 'island' is, very arguably, really just a mountain whose peak happens to stand above surrounding water. The mountain does not grow or shrink as the sea-level changes, only the area of the mountain that lies above water. That area is not the island -- for the mountain is the island and the area is not the mountain. (If you hesitate to say this, consider whether or not you should say that the island has no part that lies below sea-level: I think you will agree, on reflection, that you should not.) Perhaps, indeed, ordinary speakers confuse, or fail to distinguish between, an island and such an area of a mountain. They consequently often speak as though an island is something that can grow or shrink as the sea-level changes and will cease to exist if the sea-level rises far enough. If islands so (mis)conceived are objects of 'common-sense ontology', then so much the worse for that ontology, in this respect at least. But notice that the alternative to rejecting that (mis)conception of what islands are is not necessarily to adopt the 'radical' option of excluding islands altogether from our (considered) ontology. As we have just seen, instead of excluding them, we can identify them with objects -- mountains -- which common-sense ontology already recognizes. In this way, we achieve an advance in both coherence and economy, without resorting to the extremes of either the plenitudinous metaphysician or the ultra-parsimonious radical metaphysician.

It may perhaps be objected that, even if, pace Hawthorne, islands are not properly to be thought of as objects that literally 'grow and shrink' with changes in sea-level, my treatment of the foregoing example still commits me to the existence of objects that do behave in this fashion -- namely, areas of mountains or, more specifically, areas of mountains that lie above water. However, it seems clear that when we say something like 'The area of the mountain that lies above water grows and shrinks with changes in sea-level', we should not take ourselves to be referring, by means of the singular noun-phrase 'the area of the mountain that lies above water', to some single persisting object that grows and shrinks as a result of such changes. Rather, what we should take ourselves to be saying is just that, at different times during the course of such changes, different areas of the mountain, with different extents, lie above water. The only kinds of persisting objects that we need to invoke in an adequate treatment of such an example are mountains and seas -- objects whose existence common sense already recognizes. Similarly, the only kinds of persisting objects that we need to invoke in an adequate treatment of an example like Hirsch's are cars and garages. His fanciful notions of 'in-cars' and 'out-cars' serve no real purpose, any more than does the putative notion of a 'mountoverwater', defined as an area of a mountain that lies above water. We deceive ourselves with our own word-play if we think that we can define such 'objects' into existence.

Far from it being the case, as Hawthorne suggests, that we ought to supplement our ontology with in-cars 'on grounds of parity', because we already countenance islands, it turns out that it is not islands, but Hawthorne's implicit conception of an island that should be repudiated, along with Hirsch's notion of an in-car. I suspect that many debates in contemporary metaphysics could be improved by abandoning their impatient take-it-or-leave-it attitude towards 'common-sense ontology'. Sometimes, rather than either embrace and add to that ontology or simply reject it, we do better to reform or refine it. But if we are to do that, we need to examine it carefully -- much more carefully than many contemporary metaphysicians are apparently prepared to do. We need, that is, to engage in what P. F. Strawson famously called 'descriptive metaphysics'. Not for its own sake, but in order to develop a well-motivated and coherent 'revisionary metaphysics' -- one that takes 'common-sense ontology' as its starting point and adapts it in the light of its various deficiencies. The plenitudinous metaphysician makes the mistake of supposing that its only deficiency is one of unwarranted parsimony, so that the remedy is just to add to it. But reflection reveals that 'common-sense ontology' is in fact riddled with confusions. Fortunately, these confusions are not so severe that they cannot be ironed out, as the radical metaphysician mistakenly believes when he rejects that ontology outright. However, 'reformed common sense' is hardly an exciting banner under which to recruit an eager new generation of analytic metaphysicians -- nothing like as exciting as the plenitudinist's prospect of discovering more things in heaven and earth than are dreamt of in common-sense ontology, and nothing like as exciting as the radicalist's prospect of eliminating almost everything that is included in that ontology. Since metaphysics à la Lewis is almost everywhere engaged in the battle between these exciting extremes, its popularity is not to be wondered at. When done expertly, as it is by Hawthorne, it is a fascinating intellectual exercise. But as to whether it serves so well the age-old purpose of metaphysics -- to enable us to understand better the nature of the world that we inhabit -- I confess that I have some doubts.

Hawthorne, it seems clear, is willing to take the plenitudinous approach to hitherto uncountenanced extremes. Here is how he characterizes the 'Plenitude Lover's' approach:

According to this view, there are ever so many objects in the world, including many that are undreamt of in ordinary thought and talk. Cars exist. But so do Eli Hirsch's In-Cars … Tables exist and survive a change of colour. But when a table is painted, there is an object that up until that point is materially coincident with the table, but which is unable to survive a change of colour and so passes out of existence. And so on. Generalizing: let a modal occupation profile be a function from worlds to filled regions of space-time. The Plenitude Lover says that for every such profile there is an object whose modal pattern of spatiotemporal occupation is correctly described by that profile. (p. 53)

My complaint against the Plenitude Lover is that, in his eagerness to embrace as full an ontology as possible, he uncritically accepts all of the objects of common-sense ontology, such as tables and cars, and conceives of his expanded ontology as an extension of this. It supposedly includes, thus, such objects as one whose 'modal occupation profile' is characterizable in terms of its being coincident with a table until the table is painted a different colour, but necessarily ceasing to exist thereafter. However, if common-sense ontology had first been subjected to closer critical examination, many of its supposed objects -- quite possibly including tables -- would in all likelihood have been deemed to possess dubious credentials. Such dubiety consequently infects many of the Plenitude Lover's characterizations of the 'new' objects that he wants us to embrace. For, as a putative definition of (ontologically admissible) object, 'entity whose modal pattern of spatiotemporal occupation is correctly described by a modal occupation profile', besides being disconcertingly abstruse, is apparently subject to the difficulty that very many, if not most, 'modal occupation profiles' can in practice be given an intelligible characterization only by utilizing the unreformed vocabulary of common-sense ontology, as in the case of Hirsch's 'in-cars' and Hawthorne's unrepaintable 'table'. Could it be this fact, at least in part, that makes the Plenitude Lover's 'discovery' of a vast realm of hitherto undreamt-of objects so very much less interesting, on cool reflection, than the humble physicist's discovery of a new kind of lepton? My advice to keen young metaphysicians with ambitions to discover new kinds of objects is: retrain in physics. That will still leave plenty of work of a less exciting sort to be done by serious metaphysicians.

But let me not end on a down beat. This is a fine collection of essays and makes essential reading for anyone currently engaged in analytic metaphysics.