Metaphysical Grounding: Understanding the Structure of Reality

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Fabrice Correia and Benjamin Schnieder (eds.), Metaphysical Grounding: Understanding the Structure of Reality, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 317pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107022898.

Reviewed by Michael J. Raven, University of Victoria/University of Washington


This anthology collects eleven previously unpublished essays on the topical notion of (metaphysical) ground. Interest in ground has recently surged after a long drought. So those not actively working on ground might be unfamiliar with its problems and prospects. I begin with an overview of ground. Then I briefly summarize and comment on the essays. I conclude with my overall assessment of the anthology.


Many important philosophical claims are about what depends on what. These claims include, for example: (i) the conjunction's truth depends on the truth of its conjuncts, (ii) that an act is pious because the gods love it, (iii) that the legal facts are determined by the social facts, (iv) that the statue's beauty is explained by its physical features, (v) that the mental consists in nothing more than the physical, (vi) that normative facts hold in virtue of natural facts, and (vii) that facts about a whole derive from facts about its parts.

The diversity of these examples might lead one to doubt whether one kind of dependence unifies them. Perhaps the genus of dependence divides into various species: from epistemic to conceptual to linguistic to metaphysical, or beyond.

But it is increasingly common to find metaphysicians operating under the working hypothesis that one kind of dependence unifies examples like (i)-(vii). It is ground. And it is supposed to be distinctively metaphysical. For these examples have potential answers which impute reality with a certain kind of hierarchical structure of "levels" ordered from the more derivative "above" to the more fundamental "below" (cf. Sider (2011) on structure and ground). For example, if the normative is grounded in the physical, then reality is hierarchically structured with the normative "above" and its physical grounds "below". Whatever exactly this structure turns out to be, ground is supposed to be what induces it.

Part of what makes ground significant is its impact on important claims like (i)-(vii). Just as modality's impact on important claims earned it the status of a bona fide topic worthy of study, so too, it seems, with ground.

This isn't news to those aware of ground's venerable pedigree (cf. Correia and Schnieder's introduction). But, until very recently, contemporary philosophy ignored ground. Even the post-positivist metaphysical revival ushered in by Strawson, Kripke, Lewis, Armstrong, Fine, van Inwagen, and others largely bypassed ground. Current interest in ground traces to Fine (2001), as well as Schaffer (2009) and Rosen (2010). Their landmark essays initiated and set the agenda for ground's recent revival.

Part of why ground is now the subject of study in its own right is the growing realization that the work it is supposed to do resists assimilation to other notions, such as entailment, supervenience, or truth-making.

For one, ground is hyperintensional, whereas these other notions are typically assumed not to be hyperintensional. Thus, if arithmetic truths and set-theoretic truths are necessary, then each entails and supervenes on the other, and each has the same truthmakers (if any). But the question remains whether the arithmetic truths ground the set-theoretic truths, or the other way around.

What's more, ground provides a distinctive kind of metaphysical explanation which gives it a different logic than these other notions. Since explanation is asymmetric, ground is too. For example, if a conjunction is grounded in its conjuncts, then it is not the case that its conjuncts are grounded in it. But neither entailment nor supervenience is asymmetric in this way: the conjunction will entail, and supervene on, its conjuncts; and its conjuncts together will entail, and supervene on, the conjunction. And since explanations chain (i.e. obey a "cut", or transitivity, principle), ground does too. For example, if the physical grounds the neurological, and the neurological grounds the mental, then the physical grounds the mental. But truth-making cannot always chain because its relata needn't be of the same category (truths vs. things).

Despite this agreement about what ground is not, open questions remain about what ground is. These questions include: What is the logic of ground? Is ground contingent or necessary? Is ground univocal or are there many notions of ground? Is ground a relation? Are ground claims themselves grounded or ungrounded? How does ground relate to essence, modality, truthmaking, ontology, and to other kinds of explanation or dependence?

These open questions, among others, are ably summarized in Correia's and Schnieder's introduction. And some of these questions animate the essays they've anthologized.

Summaries and comments

Introduction: The anthology's editors, Fabrice Correia and Benjamin Schnieder, provide a helpful opinionated introduction to ground and its significance, survey many of the open questions animating current research on it, and summarize the anthology's essays. Reading this introduction gives one an accurate sense of the current state of the art. No one new to ground should overlook this introduction. Even those familiar with ground will likely find the introduction useful.

Chapter 1: Kit Fine's "Guide to ground" is a rich, wide-ranging discussion of a variety of notions of ground, their philosophical significance, their logic, and their relationship to other notions, such as truthmaking and essence. Especially intriguing is Fine's separation of ground and essence, given how a number of writers on ground have wanted to connect them. Fine's paper was already influential prior to its publication here. It will continue to guide future research.

Chapter 2: Christopher Daly's "Scepticism about grounding" argues that the best skeptical strategy against ground denies its intelligibility, and then argues that ground is indeed unintelligible. Daly's skeptical strategy has two steps. The first step is his report that his "philosophic conscience" tells him that ground is unintelligible. The second step supports this report by arguing that neither ground's logic, nor its links to more familiar notions, nor its oft-cited examples, suffice for its intelligibility. (Daly's skeptical worries are criticized in Audi's essay as well as in Raven (2012).)

Chapter 3: Paul Audi's "A clarification and defense of the notion of grounding" articulates an idiosyncratic conception of ground and defends its intelligibility against skeptical challenges raised by Oliver (1996), Hofweber (2009), and Daly's essay. Much of Audi's lucid defense relies on a cluster of background assumptions about facts, properties, and their connections to ground. Audi recognizes that this limits his audience to those who share his assumptions. But even those who do not might still be reached by Audi's main positive argument for ground: that some explanations are non-causal and, hence, invoke ground.

Chapter 4: Jonathan Schaffer's "Grounding, transitivity, and contrastivity" presents several interesting counterexamples to the orthodox view that ground is transitive. These counterexamples are intended to motivate Schaffer's (transitive) contrastivist conception of ground. This contrastivist conception of ground is intriguing and deserves further exploration. But I am unconvinced that his counterexamples motivate it (see Raven (2013) for detailed criticisms of Schaffer's counterexamples).

Chapter 5: Michael Della Rocca's "Violations of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (in Leibniz and Spinoza)" presents the dilemma that, on pain of inconsistency, one must either take some relations to be ungrounded or else reject (non-reflexive) relations by adopting the monistic view that only the world itself fundamentally exists. The dilemma seems intractable for Leibniz because his commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason precludes the first horn and his commitment to God's creating us precludes the second horn. Inspired by Spinoza, Della Rocca's initial solution takes relations, and hence their ungroundedness, to be neither "fully" intelligible nor "fully" real. But then Della Rocca argues that the initial solution ultimately requires monism. This seems to obviate Della Rocca's initial solution, since monism would have directly avoided the dilemma.

Chapter 6: J. Robert G. Williams's "Requirements on reality" outlines a strategy (detailed in Williams (2010)) for avoiding Moorean objections to radically minimal ontologies. For example, the Moorean minimalist might wish to say that there are chairs (Mooreanism) while also saying that, fundamentally, there are no chairs (minimalism). Realists about ground fulfill this wish by appeal to reality itself: the fact that there are chairs is grounded in facts not about chairs but, instead, about partless simples. But Williams's "ersatzism" about ground fulfills this wish by appeal to what representations require of reality: the semantic theorem capturing the truth-conditions for 'There are chairs' does not require reality to contain chairs but, instead, requires only partless simples arranged "chair-wise". I suspect that Williams's ersatzism will become an important alternative to realism. Comparing their merits will be fruitful.

Chapter 7: Kathrin Koslicki's "Varieties of ontological dependence" uses Finean conceptions of ontological dependence and essence to introduce two new notions of dependence. The first notion, constituent dependence, captures how a complex entity depends on its constituents (like how a set depends on its members). The second notion, feature dependence, captures how a feature depends on its bearer (like how a tomato's redness trope depends on the tomato). With few exceptions, the literature has often been inattentive to the varieties of ontological dependence. Koslicki's essay provides a much-needed service by disentangling some of them and illustrating the distinctive significance of each.

Chapter 8: E. J. Lowe's "Asymmetrical dependence in individuation" argues against structuralist ontologies which take entities of a particular kind to mutually individuate each other. Lowe's argument relies on the notion of a principle of individuation, which is distinguished from a criterion of identity. Principles of individuation, as Lowe conceives them, are one-many asymmetric relations between an entity and its individuators (entities which fix the first entity's identity). The mutual individuation of structuralist ontologies apparently violates this asymmetry, and so Lowe infers that there must be some self-individuating entities. But Lowe's discussion overlooks the option of an en masse principle of individuation: a many-many asymmetric relation between entities of a kind and their individuators. (Cf. Dasgupta (ms) for an exploration of a similar idea applied to ground.)

Chapter 9: Jody Azzouni's "Simple metaphysics and 'ontological dependence'" draws extensively from his other work in programmatically outlining a view according to which truths about non-existents (holes, properties) are explained in terms of "how it is" with existing things (Swiss cheese, objects). (In a confusing departure from standard use, Azzouni calls such explanation "ontological dependence".) What motivates Azzouni's view is the "indispensability" of truths about holes and properties together with a taste for desert landscapes omitting them from the ontology. Azzouni provocatively justifies this taste by scorning the wanton demand to explain all truths in terms of entities and how they are. But this scorn is hard to reconcile with Azzouni's own view, which explains truths about the non-existent in terms of "how it is" with existing entities.

Chapter 10: David Liggins's "Truth-makers and dependence" argues that truth-maker theorists can use ground to avoid some challenges, but then argues that truth-maker theory does not neatly cohere with natural approaches to ground. Liggins's main point is that truth-making is an unrepresentative kind of non-causal dependence and is neither the only nor the best way to cash out the truth-makers' slogan that truth depends on being. (Cf. §1.3 of Fine's essay for related misgivings about truth-making.)

Chapter 11: Stephen Barker's "Expressivism about making and truth-making" presents a cognitivist expressivist interpretation of making claims in general, which include truth-making claims as well as ground claims (since the grounded is made true by its grounds). Barker proposes that making claims express a commitment to a derivation from makers to what is made using only introduction rules (except for negations). Barker's criterion for an introduction rule P1,P2, . . . / Q is that Q contains a concept not present in any of P1,P2, . . . . Parity suggests that the criterion for an elimination rule P1,P2, . . . / Q is that Q omits a concept present in some of P1,P2, . . . But then this criterion classifies Barker's example 'Fred is an unmarried man / Fred is a bachelor' as both an introduction rule for bachelor and an elimination rule for unmarried man. Because of this, it is unclear whether the commitments a making claim expresses can be understood in terms of Barker's proposal.


These essays are varied in content. Some directly concern the nature and logic of ground (Fine, Audi, Schaffer). Others concern how ground interacts with, or applies to, other notions of dependence (Koslicki, Lowe, Liggins). Still others concern ground's application to ontology (Della Rocca, Azzouni). And a few are concerned with less than fully realist approaches to ground, or ground-like notions (Daly, Williams, Barker). Refreshingly, and in stark contrast to the essays in the recent Metametaphysics anthology (Chalmers, Manley, and Wasserman (2009)), most of this anthology's essays confidently assume that ground is a vital and respectable notion.

While these essays cover a lot of terrain, their coverage is incomplete. No one anthology can do it all. But there were some glaring omissions. Perhaps the most notable underrepresented topic was ground's status as a distinctively metaphysical kind of explanation. In contrast to how the metaphysical notion of cause is usually separated from the explanatory notion of causal explanation, ground is widely supposed somehow to bind the metaphysical and the explanatory together: somehow a fact is explained in others by being grounded in them. This raises thorny questions, only some of which were dealt with head-on in these essays. Some largely omitted questions include: What counts as evidence for or against a ground claim? (cf. Raven (2012)). What can a ground claim explain that can't be explained by other, more familiar notions? (cf. Wilson (2013)). How can diverse ground claims (e.g. conjunctions grounded in conjuncts, mental facts grounded in physical facts) be unified as ground claims? (cf. Wilson (2013)). Do ground claims themselves have grounds, or are they ungrounded? (cf. Bennett (2011) and deRosset (forthcoming)). This anthology offered little guidance on how best to proceed with these thorny questions.

Overall, this anthology is a welcome addition to the growing literature on ground. Reading it left me with the impression that, while our understanding of ground is still in its infancy and many important open questions remain to be answered (or even addressed), ground has nevertheless earned its stripes as a subject worthy of study. While there is a fair bit of variance in the quality of the essays, the quality of the anthology as a whole is good. Indeed, a few of the essays have been circulating and influencing ongoing research prior to publication here. I expect others will also become influential. As a result, no one working on ground should miss this book. It should also be of interest to those working on metametaphysical questions about the nature, status, and methodology of metaphysics. Even those interested in seemingly peripheral philosophical questions plausibly formulated in terms of ground might deepen their understanding of them by deepening their understanding of ground itself.


Bennett, Karen. (2011). "By Our Bootstraps." Philosophical Perspectives 25 (1):27-41.

Chalmers, David, David Manley, and Ryan Wasserman, eds. (2009). Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dasgupta, Shamik. (ms). "On the Plurality of Grounds."

deRosset, Louis. (forthcoming). "Grounding Explanations." Philosophers' Imprint.

Fine, Kit. (2001). "The Question of Realism." Philosophers' Imprint 1 (2):1-30.

Hofweber, Thomas. (2009). "Ambitious, Yet Modest, Metaphysics." In Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology, edited by D. Chalmers, D. Manley and R. Wasserman. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Oliver, Alex. (1996). "The Metaphysics of Properties." Mind 105:1-80.

Raven, Michael J. (2012). "In Defence of Ground." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 90 (4):687-701.

———. (2013). "Is Ground a Strict Partial Order?" American Philosophical Quarterly 50 (2):191-99.

Rosen, Gideon. (2010). "Metaphysical Dependence: Grounding and Reduction." In Modality: Metaphysics, Logic, and Epistemology, edited by B. Hale and A. Hoffmann. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schaffer, Jonathan. (2009). "On What Grounds What." In Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology, edited by D. Chalmers, D. Manley and R. Wasserman. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Sider, Theodore. (2011). Writing the Book of the World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Williams, J. Robert G. (2010). "Fundamental and Derivative Truths." Mind 119 (473):103-41.

Wilson, Jessica. (2013). "No Work for a Theory of Grounding." unpublished manuscript.