Metaphysical Themes 1274-1671

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Robert Pasnau, Metaphysical Themes 1274-1671, Oxford University Press, 2011, 796pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199567911.

Reviewed by Henrik Lagerlund, The University of Western Ontario


For the past decade there has been a growing trend in medieval scholarship and also to some extent in early modern scholarship that seeks to bridge the gap between medieval and early modern philosophy. This new trend has gradually brought medieval and early modern philosophy together and it has become clear that modern philosophy did not suddenly spring into existence through the genius of René Descartes, but gradually grew over several centuries into something that by the late seventeenth century looked very different from the Aristotelian philosophy shaped by Thomas Aquinas in the late thirteenth century. A lot happened over the four centuries in between, both in the discussions of ideas and in the culture at large independent of the philosophical ideas themselves, to shape what we have come to know as modern philosophy. Scholars are gradually coming to understand what happened during these four hundred years and how it happened. Robert Pasnau takes an important step towards an increasing understanding of the development of the philosophical issues surrounding the metaphysics of substance during these four centuries in his new book, Metaphysical Themes 1274-1671.

The start date of Pasnau's study is the death of Aquinas in 1274, and the end date in 1671 is represented by the first draft of Locke's Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Locke did not publish his famous book until 1689, but Pasnau argues that most of the central ideas, no pun intended, were formed in 1671. He sees philosophy after this time as post-scholastic. The two most important philosophical trends within his time period are what he calls Aristotelian scholasticism and the mechanical philosophy. None of this sounds very controversial, but the devil is in the details, and it is in his very detailed analysis of the philosophical ideas that Pasnau is able to show the continuity and the differences between thinkers during this time period.

If this book was written by anyone else, I would say that this is Pasnau's magnum opus, but knowing him I am sure we can await a new equally important book in the not too distant future. Metaphysical Themes 1274-1671 is truly a magnificent achievement. It is almost 800 pages long, spanning four centuries of philosophical argumentation on notions of matter, substance, accidents, extension, quantity, unity and identity. It contains historical scholarship and philosophical argumentation in a very well balanced mix in order to present the reader with a true sense of the historical position held as well as a subtle philosophical assessment of the correctness of these views. It is history of philosophy at its very best.

In an interesting and thought provoking historiographical chapter (Chapter 5), Pasnau suggests that Democritus must be added to the prevailing view of these four centuries as being dominated by the influence of Plato and Aristotle. This is certainly true, if we are talking about the later centuries in the time period under consideration, but not the fourteenth century or even the fifteenth century. It is generally thought that Lucretius' De rerum natura (On the Nature of Things) was only rediscovered in the early fifteenth century, but it only became the main source for Ancient atomism in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries.

Ancient atomism was known throughout the Middle Ages through Aristotle, and in the thirteenth century additional information was received through Averroes and Maimonides. It was not well thought of, however, until later in the fourteenth century, when new conceptualizations of substance by both William Ockham and John Buridan developed into proto-corpuscularian theories. They made atomism a more viable theory. Pasnau draws this out in a very nice way, but it seems to me that he has not quite appreciated the extent of the originality of these thinkers.

Ockham and Buridan developed what I have called a mereological account of material substance.[1] On this view a substance is nothing but the parts that make it up, and all the parts of a material substance are extended parts. If a part of the substance is replaced over time, then the numerical identity of the substance has changed as well. In their attempts to work out this novel view of substance in the fourteenth century, Ockham and Buridan as well as their followers not only made atomism a more plausible view, but also ultimately laid down the metaphysical foundation for the developments of mechanism and the mechanical philosophy. Pasnau discusses many of the elements present in this development, but he fails to put it together into a whole, and hence he fails to draw out the implications of the new view of substance seen in the fourteenth century.

The seven separate parts of Pasnau's book all deal with different aspects of the metaphysics of substance. In one particularly interesting and illuminating chapter, he deals with the theory of modes. Modes became central to Cartesian philosophy and a way for the Cartesians to reject real accidents. Descartes, for example, views motion as a mode. Historically the theory of modes has been seen to originate in the works of Francisco Suarez, but Pasnau greatly complicates its history by highlighting some of the fourteenth-century background to this theory.

Nicholas Oresme, one of Buridan's students and a well-known figure in the history of science, outlines three ways in which an accident can be conceived. In the first sense, an accident is conceived of in the standard way as a real accident, or as a real form inhering in a substance. As such it is a thing in itself and separable from the substance by God's absolute power. In the second sense, an accident is nothing outside the mind and hence identical to the substance. In the third sense, however, an accident is something's being such a way, that is, having whiteness is just being white. Oresme argues that all accidents should be understood in the third sense. He never used the terminology of 'modes', but the way he perceived accidents is very close to how Suarez understood modes.

As Pasnau shows, the terminology of modes was used in the fourteenth century, but the dominant philosophers of the time rejected any interpretation of accidents in line with Oresme's. Both Ockham and Buridan were very clear that everything existing is either a substance or an accident, and that both of these are things (res). According to them, modes cannot exist, since they would have to have some half-way kind of being. This view was hence largely forgotten until the time of Suarez.

This is one example of the very enlightening treatments of the various metaphysical issues surrounding the discussion of substance during the four centuries Pasnau considers. He should be credited with emphasizing nominalism as an absolutely central organizing concept of philosophy during these centuries. He is, of course, not advocating replacing the old concepts of 'medieval', 'scholastic', 'renaissance', 'early modern' with a new one, nor am I, but I think it is illuminating to view these four hundred years through new concepts. It will teach us a lot about how philosophy developed in this time period, and at the same time it will show us that the old categories are neither sufficient nor necessary.

Despite his clear intention to treat these four hundred years as one continuous period, Pasnau has not quite accepted the pluralism his own approach proscribes. He continuously talks about the scholastics and treats them (unclear whom the term picks out) as a group, while he treats foremost seventeenth-century philosophers as individual thinkers. This is a constant problem in contemporary scholarship and foremost early modern scholars are guilty of this. They tend to group all thinkers before Descartes together (unless, of course, they are talking about Renaissance thinkers) and call them 'scholastics' as if they all held the same view on a philosophical issue. It is not until scholars start to see fourteenth- to sixteenth-century thinkers as individual thinkers that we can expect a more balanced and historically correct view of this time period. Although Pasnau takes a very large step in the right direction, even he cannot avoid generalizing in this unfortunate way. This, of course, does not take away anything from the most valuable aspect of his book, however, which is the careful analysis of arguments and theories pertaining to aspects of the metaphysics of substance during a time when this was one of the most important philosophical issues at hand. Pasnau's work is invaluable to anyone dealing with the history of this time period as well as anyone interested in the metaphysics of substance.

[1] H. Lagerlund, "Material Substance", in J. Marenbon (ed.) Oxford Handbook of Medieval Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012: 468-485).