Metaphysics and Method in Plato's Statesman

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Kenneth M. Sayre, Metaphysics and Method in Plato's Statesman, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 265pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521866081.

Reviewed by Melissa Lane, University of Cambridge


This is an attentive, instructive and conscientious, if somewhat limited and programmatic, study. Because Sayre does not pretend to offer an overall interpretation of the dialogue (‘Readers accustomed to approaching the Statesman as a political treatise will find relatively little in this book that responds to their interests’, p.6), his perceptiveness in bringing underappreciated aspects of the method and metaphysics to the reader’s attention is not matched by an integrative effort. Readers will have to make up their own minds about the significance of his observations for an overall understanding of the dialogue. Also, because the Metaphysics half of the book is a ‘continuation of the inquiry’ (p.4) presented in Sayre’s Plato’s Late Ontology (1986) [PLO], its persuasiveness will depend to a large extent on whether the reader is convinced by the project begun in previous work. Finally, the approach of seeking commonalities across dialogues — isolated from the sort of full integrated study of any one of them — has recently been strongly criticised, and the features of the book just mentioned make Sayre especially vulnerable to that sort of criticism: he eschews a full study of any one dialogue in his zeal to trace methodological and metaphysical commitments across them. Nevertheless, for those readers who are knowledgeable about the Statesman and interested in pondering its relation to other late dialogues, the book offers many useful observations, even if only to be used as grist to their own mills.

Sayre’s twin starting points are (for Method) the remark at 285d5-7 that the purpose of the inquiry into the statesman is to make its participants better dialecticians ‘about everything’; and (for the ‘everything’ which he takes to be Metaphysics) the several theses about numbers, the Great and the Small, and the Forms, which Aristotle ascribes to Plato and which Sayre’s PLO argued are found in the Philebus, and which he argues here are also to be found in the Statesman. I will take them in turn, though the Introduction is rather oddly presented in reverse order on the grounds that Part II ‘was composed earlier’ (p.1); Part II appears closer to Sayre’s heart, and there are several points (one noted later on) in Part I where he seems to be amassing observations in order to cover the ground, without a clear view of their significance.

Method in Part I consists of six chapters. It begins with an overview of the early sections of the dialogue and the methodological aspects of the ‘myth’: as he admits, Sayre says very little about the myth itself, and what he does say does not depart significantly from previous studies observing its use in correcting the method of the inquiry. (Despite his concern for Metaphysics, Sayre has no interest in the myth’s cosmological significance as investigated by Gabriela Carone, for example.) His insistence on 285d — the dialogue could be called, he neatly if polemically suggests, ‘the dialogue on dialectical division’ (p.35 n.15) — rightly corrects studies of the dialogue (including my own) which have neglected this sentence and its import. But conversely, Sayre makes no mention of the link between Sophist (217a1-9) and Statesman (257a1-b4) in determining whether sophist, statesman, and philosopher are one, two, or three kinds, a political (and philosophical question) which is likewise established as a purpose of both dialogues.

The heart of Method are the chapters on collection and division in the Phaedrus and Sophist, followed by three chapters on paradigms in the Statesman: as a replacement for collection; in the paradigm of the weaver; and in the final definition — though again, I found little substantive, or subtle, understanding of the ‘statesman as weaver’ in these last two chapters of Part I (nothing is said about the history of political imagery of weaving, for example). Sayre usefully collects and analyses all the passages dealing with collection and division in the Phaedrus and Sophist, and his discussion of the function of collection is a real advance: he concludes that it requires prior knowledge which is necessary but not sufficient for a full definition of the phenomenon in question. Likewise, I found it instructive to think of paradigm as replacing those functions of collection in the Statesman. Both serve as ‘conceptual lenses … by which the mind’s preanalytical awareness of the subject being investigated is focused into a more fully articulate form’ (p.90), but collection does this by a sort of induction, while by contrast it may be done by the very choice of a paradigm itself. Sayre’s evidence shows how this works in practice in the Statesman, distinguishing between the letter in a familiar syllable as Paradigm A; weaving as paradigm B; and ‘the use of A in the learning process’ as Paradigm C (p.99, emphasis original), in an elucidation which helps to illuminate just how the paradigm in the Statesman is meant to work. And he makes a good case for translating paradeigma as ‘paradigm’ rather than (as I have done) ‘example’ (p.97).

On division, Sayre persuasively undermines the hierarchical picture of division which he rightly says is widely assumed. Division cannot, he argues, be a matter of (Aristotelian-like) decreasing generality, since many different paths of division can be used to define the same phenomenon, as the dialogues show. Rather, in the alternative, which is only fully formulated in Part II, Chapter 12:

Dialectical procedure begins with the positing of kinds that are determinate with respect to certain pertinent features but indeterminate in other features relevant to the project at hand. The role of division is to make these other features determinate in progressive stages … until … all features essential to the subject of inquiry have been isolated … [and] the essential nature of the subject has been made explicit. (p.237)

Back in Part I, Sayre uses diagrams to identify differing patterns of division - almost all dichotomous in the Sophist, while not so in the Statesman; both left and right-handed development in the Phaedrus and Statesman, while solely right-handed development in the Sophist. The significance of these patterns however is left underdeveloped. For the former, Sayre notes that the left-hand branches include a striking number of neologisms but does not connect this to previous work (including my own) on the role and significance of names in the divisions; for the latter, it is simply suggested that the Statesman develops a method of division as an ‘eliminative approach to definition’ (p.112) — ‘whatever we are to make of this’ (p.112).

Chapters 11 and 12 — the final chapters on metaphysics, and of the book — return to the theme of division. Chapter 11 argues that what division divides are genÄ“ as classes, and that what it divides them by (with reference to) are Forms. ‘Dialectical division is properly executed … when it segregates subclasses each with members which all participate in the same relevant Form’ (p.214). This is a large metaphysical assumption to swallow; not all readers will be persuaded that Forms can be in question with respect to angling or weaving. However, it does make sense of ’Plato’s tendency … to vacillate between the sense of Form and the sense of class in his use of the term eidos’ (p.214). Sayre further explains the direction to ‘cut through the middle’ (St. 262b) as requiring partition into subclasses that are themselves dialectically productive and can be characterised independently of one another, and adds in Chapter 12 that the notion of ‘middle’ should be understood in terms of the second kind of measurement according to due measure, not by counting. Chapter 12 further adds as exegesis of St. 263a-b that ‘all [metaphysically significant] classes are parts, but not vice versa’ (p.226).

Between Part I and these two concluding chapters of Part II lie four other chapters of Metaphysics. They begin with the identification of the language of ‘excess and deficiency’ in the Statesman (283c3-4, 283c11-d1, 285b7-8) with what are attributed as Plato’s views about the Great and the Small, the Indefinite Dyad, the Unequal, and the Unlimited, in Aristotle and some of the later commentators. PLO argued that these views are found in (above all) the Philebus; here, Sayre reviews those arguments, and argues that they are found in the Statesman as well. His study of the two kinds of measurement passage in the Statesman focuses on identifying six different formulations of the contrast between the two kinds, and resolving those differences by appeal to the Philebus. For example, the ‘being necessary for generation’ at St. 283d8-9 is identified as the Limit discussed at Phlb. 26d9-10, and he argues that various forms of Limit account for the six different formulations of the contrast (greatness and smallness as contrarieties; larger and smaller as in relation to each other versus as in relation to a norm (and which, in formulation 5, is necessary for the existence of the arts); excess and deficiency in general; the contrariety of More and Less; and the two contrasting kinds of skills of measurement). Here Sayre illuminatingly offers one of his rare remarks on the drama of the dialogues: contrasting the way in which the Philebus conversation is presented without either beginning or end as corresponding to its concern with the Unlimited, while the Statesman‘s neat beginning, middle and end corresponds to its concern with Limit in the second kind of measurement (p.183). Finally, chapter 10 suggests that the Statesman’s cryptic remark about ‘a forthcoming “exhibition” (apodeixin) of exactness itself’ (p.191; St. 284d1-2), should be understood with reference to (if not necessarily to be identified with: Sayre pulls his punches here) the ‘examination of accuracy among the arts’ at Phlb. 55d-59d.

If we grant Sayre’s claims about the Philebus metaphysics — which cannot be evaluated here without engaging with the whole corpus of his earlier work — we may still ask: what is the payoff and significance of these identifications and comparisons of the metaphysics of the Statesman with that of (inter alia, but above all) the Philebus? Readers of this review will note that I have integrated all that I had to say about Chapter 12, the final chapter of the book, into discussion of earlier chapters. Indeed, Chapter 12, which considers the method in light of the metaphysics, does not add very much to those earlier chapters, and one might think that its points are not particularly novel. That the methodological injunction of cutting through the middle should be understood with reference to due measure, not to comparative measurement, is something which a reader of the dialogue uninformed by Sayre would still be able to deduce (which is not to say that it is not useful to have it spelt out). Similarly with the relation between class, part, and kind. The whole of Sayre’s book is not more than the sum of its parts; but there is much which is valuable in those parts. (On presentation: the book is nicely and neatly produced; of minor errata I noted only the use twice of ‘ostensive’ where ‘ostensible’ is meant, on p.31 and p.139.)