Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Science: New Essays

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Matthew H. Slater and Zanja Yudell (eds.), Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Science: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 258 pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199363209.

Reviewed by Matteo Morganti, University of Rome 'Tre'


The ongoing trend of reflecting on the methodological basis of metaphysics constantly leads to new additions to the literature. Undoubtedly, the main recurring theme is the relationship, if any, between metaphysics and science; hence the prospects of a 'naturalistic' approach to metaphysical inquiry. This collection of essays edited by Matthew H. Slater and Zanja Yudell belongs to the growing series of contributions dealing with this latter topic.

As we are told on the cover flap, the volume "explores the role that metaphysics should play in our philosophizing about science." This normative endeavour, however, does not lead to a unitary, overarching view of metaphysics and the philosophy of science. Indeed, instead of this, one finds a series of largely unconnected essays that focus on different, specific aspects of the issue from a diverse and significantly heterogeneous range of standpoints. Thus, readers who have no prior perspective on naturalism, metaphysics, science and the philosophy of science are unlikely to gain one through reading this collection. However, they will no doubt benefit from the many stimulating suggestions offered at the more fine-grained level by authors coming "from the 'science end'" (p. 3). All the papers are well-written, and the case studies are dealt with in an informed and instructing way.

The collection opens with a useful introduction by Yudell. A brief overview is offered of relevant developments in the philosophy of the past century, and a useful taxonomy of approaches to metaphysics and the philosophy of science is proposed. Yudell also touches on the traditional issue of demarcation, and agrees with the widespread idea that no general criteria can be provided for sharply separating science and non-science, in this case metaphysics. Accordingly, he states that "philosophers of science . . . recognize metaphysics when they see it, and that is good enough" (p. 9). One wonders, however, if this is really so: on which basis do (or should) philosophers of science formulate their judgments? Why should they, in particular, be in charge of telling what counts as metaphysics? More importantly, it could be plausibly contended that, well-known problems with demarcation notwithstanding, in the case at hand one should at least try to say more. After all, it is probably borderline cases that are the most interesting for philosophers and, more generally, it seems hard to say anything truly interesting about the relationship between x and y without assuming some definition (debatable as it might be) of x and y that goes beyond the identification of putatively unproblematic instances. Be this as it may, let us now have a look at the essays contained in the collection -- which, as mentioned, are best evaluated separately.

Katherine Brading discusses Newton's work in the Principia, and argues that it represents a turning point in the history of metaphysics. In particular, says Brading, Newton's distinctions between absolute and relative, true and apparent, and mathematical and common time are instrumental to his project of defining a 'system of the world' on a scientific basis. And this entails that they are empirically grounded and never operate at a purely abstract level, disconnected from the actual world that scientists -- as well as laymen -- interact with. The foregoing leads Brading to regard the Principia as the earliest example of what she calls 'empiricist metaphysics.' This claim is interesting and well-argued (albeit with too many interim summaries of what has been said and is going to be said). Yet, a much more explicit account of the key concepts, and especially of the interplay between the empirical and the non-empirical, would have helped. Insofar as scientific theories are also always grounded on non-empirical assumptions\, that a 'system of the world' emerges from one's theory does not entail that the former complies with empiricist standards in an obvious way. Brading explicitly states, for instance, that "Newton stipulates that time 'flows equably'" (p. 38, italics added). While this lends support to her distinction between space and time based on the fact that "all rulers are perfect rulers . . .while. . . not all clocks are perfect clocks" (p. 36), the notion of stipulation points to an a priori element whose role in the context of Newton's methodology and philosophy of time (and hence, in the more general context of empiricist metaphysics) should be further elucidated.

Michael Strevens presents a fascinating argument against the 'wedding cake' compositional model of reality, according to which the world is essentially like a Lego building. Strevens claims that such a model is unable to handle complexity, and puts forward an alternative: so-called 'enion probability analysis' - a view whereby the focus is not on interacting individuals ('enions'), but rather on probabilities corresponding to "aggregate properties of populations" (p. 46). Enion probability analysis allegedly steers clear of problems with complexity, as the relevant probabilities do not track individual behaviours and interactions explicitly and are mutually independent, so allowing one to always stay within the boundaries of a manageable calculus.

In view of this, says Strevens, enion probability analysis should at least be regarded as a complement to traditional compositional views, and the same holds for all 'distributed ontologies' of this sort. The proposal is intriguing, but one would like to hear more about its precise metaphysical import. If probabilities, and the basic items of distributed ontologies more generally, are dependent on actual systems that 'bear' them, does this not mean that the latter, and consequently the compositional model of reality, remain 'ontologically dominant'? If they are basic, are we supposed to reify probabilities or, say, the superposition of different wave frequencies (p. 52)?

Next, Slater makes the compelling claim that metaphysics cannot simply be extracted from science, as whatever lesson we may learn from actual science is to be determined on grounds that are partly non-empirical. The thesis that species are extended composite objects qualifying as individuals, for example, appears compatible with what we know of the biological domain. However, it leads to the acceptance of objective indeterminacy in the world, a conclusion that cannot be evaluated on a purely empirical basis. Something similar happens, says Slater, in the case of the homeostatic property cluster view of species, which is no doubt explanatorily powerful but might be (and has been) rejected on the basis of the empirically underdetermined hypothesis that higher taxa are monophyletic. Slater's conclusion is that there is no simple recipe for naturalizing metaphysics, and "progressively naturalistic metaphysics [should be regarded] as a regulative ideal" (p. 76. Not surprisingly, Slater distances himself from the more radically naturalistic view presented in James Ladyman and Don Ross's well-known Every Thing Must Go (see also Ladyman's contribution to this volume). This sounds very sensible, and it is hoped that the claims and suggestions contained in this essay will be developed into a more systematic view in the future.

C. Kenneth Waters argues for the bold conclusion that reality has no general ontological structure spanning all scales. He first rejects the primacy given to physics by many authors (including Ladyman), and then looks at the philosophy of biology, and, in particular, at the history of the concept of gene. He notes that hypothetical science-oriented metaphysicians living in the 1930s would have concluded from an assessment of the best science available to them that the gene exists and is the fundamental unit of heredity (the 'classical gene'). Since we have now abandoned this view, replacing it with a much more flexible 'molecular gene' concept that plays several functions and lacks a precise fundamental structure, Waters concludes that (i) there is no unitary concept of gene to be found, corresponding to allegedly objective 'joints of nature'; and (ii) generalizing, one may conjecture that there is no general structure of reality.

Waters is certainly right that philosophers, including those doing metaphysics, should not look at science in the abstract, but rather consider it in its practice and historical development. Doing so no doubt fosters awareness of the fact that putative fundamental facts, levels, entities or what have you are hard to find, even from a science-informed perspective. On the other hand, Waters himself acknowledges that his realistic but pluralistic and anti-foundationalist stance is not the only option available. Indeed, one may insist that reality has a fundamental unity (or, perhaps, a unitary foundation), and prefer an historically grounded, anti-realist view of science to the idea that there is 'no general structure' (notice that Waters' own conclusion depends on historically contingent facts concerning current biology). Waters' preferences aside, the reader is left wondering how, lacking precise methodological indications, the choice is to be made.

Jenann Ismael attempts to outline a novel empiricist analysis of modal notions. Since modality is important for both philosophy and science, reductionist projects in the 'Humean' tradition -- aiming to reduce, say, laws of nature to regularities of a certain type, or chances to frequencies -- have an obvious appeal. However, according to Ismael, these projects are destined to fail, as the modal always outstrips the actual. To get out of this stalemate, Ismael puts forward a view whereby modality corresponds to 'guesses' about conditionals that we build out of the available data, with a view to using them as "partially prepared solutions to frequently encountered problems" (p. 120). Ismael regards this as middle-way option between reification and traditional reduction, focusing on hypothetical reasoning and decision rather than on abstract beliefs and knowledge. This is probably the most ambitious paper in the collection, and Ismael's suggestion surely deserves to be taken seriously. However, as in analogous cases, more needs to be said in order to establish whether or not one has truly identified a new theoretical option. On the one hand, the emphasis on decision and action suggests a pragmatic attitude that may recommend agnosticism with respect to metaphysics (Ismael explicitly refers to the instrumentalism of Dewey). On the other hand, Ismael's reluctance to accept the Humean approach appears to imply a more committed stance. But what should be added to the non-modal, then, if it is not objective modal facts?

Kyle Stanford critically assesses different ways in which metaphysics may be done in connection to science. What he calls 'scientific (or scientistic) metaphysics' aims to discover the fundamental structure of the world with the help of science, while remaining clearly distinct from the latter. It, says Stanford, problematically presupposes scientific realism. Thus, one should opt for either 'complementary metaphysics,' which attempts instead to include metaphysics in an integrated form of inquiry, each part of which depends on the others, or the 'metaphysics of science,' seeking to answer questions about the metaphysical commitments of our best scientific theories. According to Stanford, however, these too have clear shortcomings, as -- apparently -- they fail to add anything of value to what science alone contributes to the inquiry at hand.

Here, it must be pointed out, there is no clear supporting argument to be found, as Stanford relies more than is desirable on personal preference and intuition -- witness the number of expressions such as 'I suspect,' 'I do not see how' that populate the paper (pp. 134-5 in particular). Stanford claims that it is plausible to think that "most of the time the sort of examination undertaken in the metaphysics of science makes little contribution to this integrated naturalistic enterprise, at least of any sort that is broadly recognizable by contemporary scientists themselves" (p. 138). A legitimate position, for sure, but many questions remain. Does the 'most of the time' qualification not require one to draw further differentiations? And why should scientists have a priority in determining whether metaphysics is useful or not? It looks as though what is at work here is the frequent misconception that, if metaphysics is to be of interest at all, it has to be useful for/from the viewpoint of scientists (all of them? the majority? the most authoritative?). The present writer simply does not see any good reason for believing this to be the case.

Ladyman offers a welcome defence and elaboration of the key claims made in the abovementioned Every Thing Must Go. The defence is welcome especially because it does not employ the briskly polemical style of the book itself, too often accompanied by arguments that are not given detailed elaboration. Ladyman restates, and spells out further, the earlier claims that metaphysics has a methodology based on intuition and hypothetical reasoning, lacks a core of commonly accepted truths, and is merely based on a cost-benefit analysis of the pragmatic type, and that, as a result, metaphysics does not and cannot provide knowledge. Based on this, Ladyman goes on to remind the reader that the only acceptable metaphysics that can be read off from science is a metaphysics of structure, in particular a mixture of 'ontic structural realism' and 'rainforest realism' whereby Dennettian patterns play a central ontological role.

While this is all useful, some of the doubts that were raised when the book came out persist: what is really the role of intuition in metaphysics and in science? Can metaphysics not connect, at least indirectly, to empirical data, for example by providing the conceptual tools for interpreting scientific theories? (In this connection, it is surprising to read, in footnote 10, that "particles are not intrinsically individuated individuals": unless one is to presuppose an idiosyncratic conception of intrinsic individuation, this is far from having been established.) Also, why should unification be considered particularly important if pragmatic virtues more generally are not? And how exactly does it lead to an ontology of patterns? Relatedly, what is a structure, or pattern? (Should we believe that the Carnot cycle -- see the example on p. 153 -- is among the basic entities constituting reality?) Are these not genuinely metaphysical concepts whose clarification and assessment requires a milder characterisation of metaphysics than that recommended by Ladyman?

In a way sharing and reaffirming Ladyman's scepticism, Juha Saatsi compares explanatory considerations as they appear in science and in metaphysics. He argues that, although inference to the best explanation is ubiquitous, only in science is it complemented by experimental feedback, and only in science does it lead to something that may qualify as progress. Explanationism in metaphysics, adds Saatsi, also fails to find support in considerations of unification, understanding and Quinean indispensability -- if only because these are already problematic in the case of science. Saatsi's arguments merit further reflection but, as they stand, fail to establish more than a difference of degree between science and metaphysics. This, especially in view of the fact that - to repeat - the problem of demarcation remains open, hence reference to 'empirical feedback' cannot have a straightforward outcome.

Jim Woodward provides an entertaining dialogue with a view to illustrating the grounds for his agnosticism towards metaphysics, in particular when it comes to the philosophical analysis of causal notions. Woodward aims to defend a philosophy of science that focuses on actual practice without getting involved with things that are putatively 'fundamental' and 'deep.' His arguments are sensible, and many readers will probably find reasonable the recommendation not to seek the 'metaphysically primitive' and instead "use experimentation to establish conclusions about causal relationships independently of putative underlying details" (p. 208). However, a warning is in order: metaphysics isn't necessarily the sort of reductionist activity, aiming to translate anything and everything in terms of fundamental entities, that Woodward has in mind. It might also be understood, and is probably best understood, as the exploration of different ways the world might be, including some in which the very idea of a fundamental level or entity and/or the possibility of reduction are explicitly ruled out at the outset. In this sense, Woodward's convincing criticism of the Best System Analysis of natural laws is perhaps a bit misleading.

The closing chapter contains a reflection on metaphysical questions concerning scientific models, mathematical structures and fictional objects as they are used in science and studied by philosophers of science. Martin Thomson-Jones argues against what he calls the 'bracketing strategy,' which consists in accepting talk involving the relevant abstract objects, while at the same time resisting ontological commitment. His basic point is that the 'as-if' approach to models and the like cannot but be implemented on the basis of a specific understanding of such objects from the ontological point of view, i.e., by saying something substantial about their existence and properties. Instrumentalists about metaphysics are likely to respond that, even if one makes positive claims about the nature and existence of abstract objects, the resulting discourse could still be understood conditionally, hence realism still does not follow. Slightly differently, one may contend that the as-if approach requires specifying the nature of the relevant objects, but not whether they actually exist or not. Again, more methodological discussion is in order.

In conclusion, this collection contains significant, thought-provoking material, especially from the viewpoint of researchers approaching the topic of metaphysics in the philosophy of science with supporting background knowledge, and perhaps some pre-existing personal opinions and beliefs on the matter. It is also certainly of relevance for people interested in the specific topics that are discussed, such as the methodology of Newton's Principia, the status of biological concepts, or interventionist approaches to causation. Those looking for a more systematic, detailed and encompassing view of the interplay of metaphysics and science  will be disappointed, and probably also frustrated by the many questions that are left open and by the tension existing between at least some of the claims contained in the book. People belonging to this group had better look elsewhere -- or perhaps just wait until a compelling treatment is eventually offered.