Metaphysics and the Representational Fallacy

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Heather Dyke, Metaphysics and the Representational Fallacy, Routledge, 2007, 186pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415956697.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Cornell University


The main theme in Heather Dyke's book is that philosophers all too often argue from claims about language to conclusions about non-linguistic reality. The "representational fallacy" she refers to is "a general philosophical tendency to place too much emphasis on the significance of language when doing ontology" (p. 14), or as she elsewhere puts it, "a general strategy of reading metaphysics off language" (p. 7). She argues that philosophers committing the representational fallacy are blind to otherwise plausible theoretical options. The main case she discusses is the debate over A-theories and B-theories in the philosophy of time, but she also brings up, among other things, moral realism, puzzles about spatiotemporal coincidence, and the indispensability argument in the philosophy of mathematics.

Dyke's claim is that, guilty of the representational fallacy, philosophers discussing the existence of Fs assume there to be only four theoretical options: (i) non-reductive realism about Fs, (ii) the view that paraphrase of F-talk reveals that F-discourse is not committed to Fs, (iii) error theory about Fs, according to which committing F-sentences are false, (iv) the view that F-discourse lacks a descriptive function. But, Dyke urges, there is a further, all too often overlooked option: that F-sentences are objectively true, have a descriptive function, and are non-paraphrasable: but the truth of F-sentences doesn't imply the existence of Fs, for the truthmaker need not "involve the existence of the entities apparently referred to by terms in the sentence" (p. 4). Henceforth I will refer to this as the Overlooked Strategy. (I am capitalizing to indicate that this is a proper name, and to signal that I am not convinced that the Overlooked Strategy really is an overlooked strategy.)

In the case of philosophy of time, this plays out in a slightly different way. There Dyke's claim, on behalf of the "new B-theory" (earlier defended by, e.g., D.H. Mellor (1998)), is that tensed sentences may be objectively true and not paraphrasable by tenseless sentences, while yet they are made true by the tenseless facts postulated by the B-theory, so the B-theory is the correct metaphysics of time. Dyke claims that the new B-theory, properly understood, is an example of the Overlooked Strategy at work.

Dyke's book is very rich. While primarily devoted to reflections on the methodology of metaphysics, it also deals with many specific metaphysical issues. However, the book’s richness is also the source of some of its problems. It might have been better if Dyke had further developed some of her central distinctions and arguments. The question of the relation between claims about language and claims about non-linguistic reality is difficult, and interesting. I will not in this review directly attempt to make headway on it. What I will be concerned to argue is that even someone sympathetic with the main thrust of Dyke's book, and who thinks that contemporary work in analytic philosophy tends to commit some sort of "representational fallacy", has reason to find fault with the treatment of central issues.

As Dyke herself mentions, her characterization of the "representational fallacy" is vague. When she tries to be more careful, she discusses what she calls SLT, the "strong linguistic thesis", according to which

there is a privileged true description of reality, the sentences of which (a) stand in a one-one correspondence with facts in the world, and (b) are structurally isomorphic to the facts with which they correspond. (p. 7)

Dyke claims that it is due to the acceptance of SLT that theorists overlook the Overlooked Strategy (p. 7). Since Dyke takes philosophers such as Quine, who do not admit facts into their ontology, to accept SLT (pp. 95-100), I assume we are not to understand SLT as reifying facts.

SLT, as stated, appears to be the claim that there is a (possibly proper) subset of the true sentences, such that this subset satisfies (a) and (b). And Dyke explicitly commits herself to this reading. On p. 45 she makes clear that the privileged true description of reality would contain a subset of all truths there are. And later (p. 71) she says that her opponents "are committed to there being a privileged true description of reality; that description contains only a subset of all the truths that there are, and that subset of truths is ontologically perspicuous".

But this is odd. For there just is no conflict between SLT and the Overlooked Strategy, with SLT understood this way. Focus for instance on Dyke's preferred version of the B-theory in the philosophy of time. It can be that there are true tensed sentences not paraphrasable in tenseless terms, while the privileged true description of reality contains only tenseless sentences. However, if, contrary to how Dyke explicitly understands SLT, we understand SLT as the thesis that the set of all true sentences must satisfy (a) and (b), then we do get a conflict between SLT and the Overlooked Strategy. (Call this SLT*, for future reference.)

Dyke announces in the Introduction that she will argue against SLT "by showing that two or more non-synonymous true sentences can have the same truth-maker" and says that there being examples of this further makes it clear "that we cannot move from linguistic facts about any of those sentences to conclusions about the nature of their common truthmaker" (p. 7). Suppose sentences S and S* are a pair of sentences like this. What Dyke must be assuming, when taking this pair to be a problem for SLT, is that S and S* correspond to the same fact but since S and S* are non-synonymous, they can't both satisfy the two conditions mentioned in SLT. However, given how Dyke understands SLT this is not sufficient for a counterexample to SLT. For while it could perhaps be a problem for SLT if S and S* were both part of the privileged true description of reality (T), a pair of two non-synonymous sentences of which at most one is part of T does not present a problem for SLT. But if we take Dyke's target rather to be SLT*, this problem is avoided.

Dyke's argument against SLT is problematic also in other ways. For I think most theorists would allow that while "sample a is water" and "sample a is H2O" are not synonymous, they have the same truthmaker. And what is more, the fact that these sentences have the same truthmaker does not support the claim that sentences about water don't imply the existence of water: rather, the natural thing to say is that the existence of H2O suffices for the existence of water. If indeed SLT can be refuted the way Dyke says it can be, then one may worry that Dyke is arguing against a straw man. And the falsity of SLT does not itself support the availability of the Overlooked Strategy, any more than the point about water and H2O supports the Overlooked Strategy. Or perhaps, Dyke would say that 'water'-sentences are made true by H2O-facts, and since this is so the Overlooked Strategy somehow is applicable in the case of water. But then I don't see why one should think that the Overlooked Strategy is an overlooked strategy. Generally, although Dyke occasionally mentions the sort of aposteriori reductionism of which the claim that water is identical with H2O is a paradigmatic instance, she does not pay much attention to it. One reason for this is that it does not fit neatly into her taxonomy. She might intend to subsume it under the paraphrase strategy, but the paraphrase strategy as Dyke primarily discusses it involves synonymy claims.

Dyke is explicit that her main concern is to combat the strategy of arguing from claims about language to claims about non-linguistic reality. But one can subscribe to SLT without endorsing the criticized strategy. For SLT just says that a sentence belongs to a privileged true description of reality exactly if the right relation holds between that sentence and a fact. One can take that claim to be true while thinking that the way to do metaphysics is by first, so to speak, doing the metaphysics and arriving at a hypothesis concerning what facts there are, and then drawing from this conclusions about what (privileged) true sentences there are. Hence, one can take SLT to be true while not reading metaphysics off language. Later I will return to SLT and argue that it is not clear that Dyke's own preferred metaphysical view requires her to reject it, when it is read in Dyke's way, as being only about a possibly proper subset of the true sentences.

An application Dyke turns to in chapter 6 is the debate over moral realism. She mentions objections to moral realism, such as the worry regarding how the realist can accommodate the seeming fact that moral beliefs by themselves motivate and Moore's open question argument. Dyke's response to this and other worries is to say that moral sentences are made true by non-moral facts. She calls this "truthmaker naturalism" (p. 138). This thesis helps with the open question argument, for the open question argument is primarily compelling as an argument against the claim that moral predicates are synonymous with non-moral predicates. But how is it supposed to help the realist deal with the argument from motivation? Dyke's suggestion (p. 142) is that if the facts which make moral beliefs true are non-moral, then it is something special about the beliefs -- the something which makes the beliefs moral -- rather than about the facts to which they correspond which explains how moral beliefs can motivate. But Dyke does not really say what it is that makes a belief moral, so the suggestion remains radically underdeveloped. Moreover, those inclined to press the argument from motivation against moral realism typically subscribe to a 'Humean' claim that beliefs can never by themselves motivate. Against such a theorist it is pointless simply to insist that some beliefs can motivate in virtue of what kinds of beliefs they are. A few pages earlier (p. 140), Dyke refers to James Dreier's (e.g. 1990) suggested theory according to which moral sentences have the same character, in Kaplan's sense, as used by different speakers, but express different contents depending on what normative system is salient. Maybe Dyke means to suggest that Dreier's theory has the resources to explain how moral beliefs can motivate. But it is odd if she means to rely wholesale on Dreier's theory when defending moral realism, for Dreier's theory is explicitly a relativist theory designed to satisfy motivations behind expressivism.

Dyke briefly mentions what she calls semantic naturalism in metaethics: the view that moral predicates, although not synonymous with non-moral predicates, can be necessarily coextensive with non-moral predicates, where the necessity can be aposteriori. (Compare again the relation between 'is water' and 'is H2O'.) This is a familiar metaethical view. In fact, it is one of the most important forms of moral realism. Dyke insists that her truthmaker naturalism is different from this semantic naturalism. Maybe so. But still, it remains the case that semantic naturalism has the same supposed good-making features that her truthmaker naturalism does. Although Dyke fails to mention it, semantic naturalists have prominently argued for their view by appeal to how it helps with the open question argument. And if Dyke's proposed response to the argument from motivation works, I do not see why it would not be as available to the semantic naturalist as it is to the truthmaker naturalist.

A recurring theme in Dyke's book concerns the method of paraphrase. Appeal to paraphrase is one of the four strategies Dyke mentions as common strategies in metaphysics, and she thinks the centrality of appeal to paraphrase is due to overemphasis on language. But 'paraphrase' means different things in different parts of the book. When the idea of paraphrase first makes its appearance, in the Introduction (p. 1f), a paraphrase is supposed to be a replacement sentence with the same meaning as the original sentence "but which lacks its unwanted ontological commitments" (p. 2). Call this the synonymy conception of paraphrase. Note that on the synonymy conception of paraphrase, a sentence and its paraphrase must have the same truth-value. The synonymy conception of paraphrase is problematic, for reasons noted by William Alston (1958): if two sentences have the same meaning then they have the same ontological commitments, contrary to how the synonymy conception would have it. (Dyke later (p. 85) presents somewhat related considerations, but without noting that they are well-known.)

However, later Dyke discusses van Inwagen (1990) as a paraphraser. But van Inwagen is not concerned to provide sentences synonymous with the ontologically offending sentences. Rather, he thinks the ontologically offending sentences are literally false, and offers his true 'paraphrases' as what we really assert in ordinary uses of the offending sentences. (In other words, he thinks we do not ordinarily use the offending sentences to assert the propositions they literally express.) Dyke may want to regard van Inwagen's real view as a kind of error theory. But regarding it as such forces a distinction between claims Dyke fails to properly distinguish between: the claim that atomic sentences of a discourse are systematically untrue, and the claim that speakers engaging in the discourse tend to be guilty of systematic error. The distinction is important. Given the distinction, it is possible to insist that while it would be very unattractive to charge speakers with systematic error, saying that many sentences are untrue is a different claim.

In chapter 7, Dyke discusses statue and lump cases -- cases of purported spatiotemporal coincidence -- and argues that sentences which the Quinean would say are ontologically committing to statues are true, but made true by facts about lumps of clay. This is supposed to help with the problem of coincidence (for there are no facts about statues 'over and above' facts about lumps of clay). Is this a way of saying that statues exist, but doing so 'in virtue of' facts about lumps of clay, or is this a way of denying the existence of statues (while holding on to the claim that ordinary statue-sentences are true)? Dyke clearly takes the former line (pp. 147, 149). But when she turns to philosophy of mathematics, and suggests that mathematical sentences can be made true by truthmakers involving only non-mathematical entities (p. 164f), she indicates that the upshot of this application of the Overlooked Strategy is to say that mathematical sentences are true but mathematical entities do not exist. She does not explain what is supposed to allow her to say one thing in the case of statues and another in the case of mathematical entities. More problematically still, the Overlooked Strategy, as introduced, was the strategy of saying that F-sentences can be true, but be made true by non-F-facts, so that one need not say that Fs exist. But then what Dyke says about statues is not after all an instance of the Overlooked Strategy.

Many of my critical remarks concern specific features of Dyke's discussion, and do not tell directly against Dyke's general outlook. Setting worries about how Dyke puts things on the side, her discussion certainly suggests a coherent and potentially interesting view: one on which the central question for ontology isn't that of whether "there are Fs" is true but that of whether Fs are among the truth-makers for true sentences. The claim thus stated is neutral on whether in a case like this we should say that Fs exist or not. Arguably one can go either way on that question, and still have an interesting view. But since this view isn't kept sharply in focus, the discussion isn't as helpful regarding how it should be assessed as one might want.

Lastly, let me turn to some general concerns. Dyke is concerned with the idea that we can read off the structure of reality from the structure of language. But what exactly is it supposed to mean that we can do so? Hardly anyone thinks that every linguistic expression refers, so that facts contain elements corresponding to every constituent of a sentence. The view under attack must rather be thought of as involving the more restricted claim that reality contains elements corresponding to specific bits of language, such as names, predicates and sentences; e.g. that the truth of a sentence "a is F" requires the existence of the object a and the property of being F. Already this view is sophisticated enough that it doesn't involve any straightforward reading off the structure of reality from the structure of language. Of course, the friend of the view under discussion draws conclusions regarding what exists from what sentences are true. But is she any different, in this respect, from someone who refuses to draw these ontological conclusions from "a is F" but draws these ontological conclusions from the truth of "a exists" and "the property of being F exists"? If she is different, what exactly makes her so? Both theorists just described draw ontological conclusions from what sentences are true: it is only that they focus on different true sentences. Why, exactly, should we take the difference to be such that while the former theorist takes an objectionably linguistic approach to ontology, the latter theorist does not?

I earlier made the point that the Overlooked Strategy is in fact consistent with adherence to SLT.

Now, Dyke herself doesn't only want to make a case for the Overlooked Strategy: she also, tentatively, expresses sympathy for a metaphysics of only particulars: the only entity that the truth of a sentence of the form "a is F" requires is the object a (p. 84). The sentence is true because this object is a particular way. One may think that at least if Dyke's preferred metaphysics is true there cannot be a privileged description of reality, for any language must employ an apparatus of predication; there can be no language with only names. I think, however, that there are several reasons to be doubtful of this. Here is one. Consider the sort of language Wilfrid Sellars discussed in "Naming and Saying" (1962): a language without predicates where we just write names in different configurations, and in different colors, etc. Someone who believes only in particulars might take such a Sellarsian language to be more ontologically perspicuous. For all Dyke argues, the structure of the a sentences of Sellars' language corresponds to the structure of the corresponding bit of reality. But then the friend of Dyke's preferred metaphysics can subscribe to SLT anyway. There is a true description of the kind she mentions: it is only that this description is couched in a Sellarsian language. (Someone might protest that surely Dyke must mean to speak of descriptions in natural language. But prominent targets of hers, including Quine, would want to leave natural language behind.)

The problems I have brought up in the last few paragraphs serve to illustrate a worry one might have regarding Dyke's characterization of the "representational fallacy". She describes this "fallacy" as the "general strategy" of, as she puts it, "reading metaphysics off language". But what is reading metaphysics off language supposed to be? Surely not drawing metaphysical conclusions simply based on what linguistic resources we happen to have. That would be silly. We have the word "unicorn" but there are no unicorns. More plausibly, "reading metaphysics off language" is a matter of drawing metaphysical conclusions from premises about what sentences are true. But what could be the matter with that? Of course, some metaphysicians might misunderstand their language and draw the wrong conclusions. But much linguistic philosophy has been devoted precisely to preventing mistakes of this kind (witness, e.g., talk of category mistakes). And surely it cannot be the case that we can never draw metaphysical conclusions from premises about what sentences are true. Can I not from the truth of "In the metaphysically relevant sense, Fs exist" draw the conclusion that in the metaphysically relevant sense, Fs exist?

To briefly sum up: Dyke's negative aim is to combat what she calls the representational fallacy, often in the specific guise of SLT; her positive aim is to make a case for the Overlooked Strategy. But SLT is an ill-chosen target for a number of reasons; it is unclear what the representational fallacy -- the supposedly fallacious strategy of reading metaphysics off language -- amounts to; and the supposed advantages of the Overlooked Strategy are had by strategies well-represented in the literature.


Alston, William: 1958, "Ontological Commitment", Philosophical Studies 9: 8-17.

Dreier, James: 1990, "Internalism and Speaker Relativism", Ethics 101: 6-26.

Mellor, D.H.: 1998, Real Time II, Routledge, London and New York.

Sellars, Wilfrid: 1962, "Naming and Saying", Philosophy of Science 29: 7-26.

van Inwagen, Peter: 1990, Material Beings, Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York.