Metaphysics and the Tri-Personal God

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William Hasker, Metaphysics and the Tri-Personal God, Oxford University Press, 2013, 269pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199681518.

Reviewed by Keith E. Yandell, University of Wisconsin-Madison/Trinity International University


Analytic theology is a comparatively new enterprise in which philosophers and theologians in the analytic tradition provide carefully stated expressions of Christian doctrine and appraise the work of others who do likewise. William Hasker's book appears in the Oxford University Press series on Analytic Theology.

The book is divided into three parts. In Part I, Hasker deals with difficult topics as he perceptively discusses pro-Nicene doctrine in the Cappadocians and Augustine, taking the fourth century as the high point of trinitarian doctrine. Part II includes clear discussions of the trinitarian views of contemporary theologians (Karl Barth, Karl Rahner, John Zizioulas, Jürgen Moltmann) and philosophers (Brian Leftow, Peter van Inwagen, Jeffrey Brower and Michael Rea, William Lane Craig, Richard Swinburne, Keith Yandell). All of this is preparatory for his own view of the Trinity in Section III, on which we will focus.

His purpose is to defend Social Trinitarianism as opposed to Latin Trinitarianism. A rough characterization of the difference is that the former wants first to protect the 'threeness' of the Trinity in the light of the divinity of Son and Holy Spirit and the latter wants first to protect the monotheism that characterizes both Judaism and Christianity. Alternatively, the former must make clear how it differs from the view that there are three gods (tri-theism) and the latter must make clear how it differs from the view that "Father", "Son", and "Holy Spirit" simply name roles that God plays (modalism). Trinitarian theologians must walk the narrow road between polytheism and unitarianism, in agreement at least that there is such a road.

The overall discussion is informed and rigorous. Its scope is impressive. Fourth century creeds provide much of the theological foundation of Part III. The issue of Biblical sanction of the begetting and proceeding doctrines is discussed briefly, and Hasker suggests a broader approach to theology than one that would make paucity of exegetical support decisive.

His conclusions are traditional. The begetting and proceeding doctrines are offered as a successful basis for explaining the "threeness" of the Trinity. Hasker (rightly) takes the doctrine that the Father begets the Son as meaning that the Father causes the Son. (What could "begetting" mean if it is not a causal term, an analogous use of the word being granted?) The relevant notion of causality does not require temporal priority of the cause. If God is eternal (timeless), then the causality is timeless. If God is everlasting then the causality is everlasting. Either way, no temporal priority goes to the cause. The same considerations apply to the doctrine that the Father and the Son (or just the Father) 'spirate' the Holy Spirit.

To make a brief detour, Neo-Platonism uses the notion of emanation when it claims that the One (at the top rung of the ladder of being) causes the Intellect (the being one rung down).[1] The idea is that the higher by its nature causes the lower. Waiving the higher-lower aspect of the idea, the begetting doctrine includes its being the Father's nature to beget the Son, and the proceeding doctrine that it is the Father's nature and the Son's nature (or just the Father's) to 'spirate' the Holy Spirit. Thus it is not possible that the Father exist and the Son not exist, or that the Father and Son (or just the Father) exist and the Holy Spirit not exist. It is not possible that the Trinity have been a binity or a unitarian God. Barring hierarchy, it seems fair to say that begetting and spirating are emanating.

All this may seem as it should be. There is, however, a problem. Aseity is the property of existing in such a manner as not to depend causally on anything else. On the begetting doctrine, the Father has aseity and the Son lacks it, and, on the proceeding doctrine, the Holy Spirit lacks it. The second and third Persons have what we might call 'next door to aseity' -- aseity regarding every being but one (or perhaps in the case of the third Person, two). So two of the Persons lack a property arguably essential to deity. This is not alleviated by pointing out that the Father cannot exist without the Son and the Holy Spirit. If it is a necessary truth that if x exists, then x causes y to exist, then x cannot exist unless y does. But it is the Father who acts and the Son who results. It is the Father and Son (or just the Father) who act(s) and Spirit who results. Aseity is the property existing without being caused by anything else. The Father has it and the Son and Holy Spirit lack it, given the begetting and proceeding doctrines. The problem threatens the full deity of two thirds of the Trinity. Hasker deals with this in a partially traditional and partially contemporary manner.

Before we leave the begetting and proceeding doctrines, we should note that a typical defense of begetting and proceeding is that they provide a way (perhaps the only way) of individuating the three Persons. (For these purposes, both the Father and the Son spirating the Holy Spirit seems preferable.) Consider instead the doctrine that the Father depends for existence on the Son and Holy Spirit, the Son depends for existence on the Father and the Holy Spirit, and the Holy Spirit depends for existence on the Father and the Son. Then there are only co-dependence relations that individuate the Persons and no threat of hierarchy. So begetting and proceeding is not the only possible basis for individuation.

Concern about hierarchy in the Trinity is supposed to be removed by what appears to be a self-contradictory doctrine to the effect that the trinitarian Persons all have theconcrete divine nature. Hasker quotes Aquinas who raises the issue only to dismiss it: "among creatures, the nature of the one generated is not numerically identical with the nature the one generating has . . . But God begotten receives numerically the same nature God begetting has."[2]

Hasker claims to provide an everyday example of a shared concrete essence. Mainly following Lynne Rudder-Baker, he defines "being constituted by":

x (which is of primary kind F) constitutes y at time t just in case:

1. x and y are spatially coincident at t

2. x is in G-favoring circumstances at t

3. necessarily, if an item of primary kind F is in G-favorable circumstances at t, there is an object of primary kind G that is spatially coincident with that object at t

4. it is possible for x to exist at time t but for there to be no object of primary kind G that is spatially coincident with x at t.

This is offered regarding material constitution and must be revised to fit God. Thus 1 and 4 are replaced by:

1*. x and y have the same parts (if x and y are simple, they satisfy this vacuously)

4*. It is possible for the divine nature to exist but for there to be no divine trinitarian person that has all its parts in common with that nature.

The primary kind G is 'Trinitarian Person'. 'X' is "the divine mind/soul/concrete divine essence".

Hasker offers an example of numerically different items sharing a concrete trope: a chunk of marble sculpted so as to be a Statue that also serves as a Pillar. Then the Constitutionalist's core claim is stated: the persistence conditions of Pillar differ from those of Statue, and conversely, and Chunk's are different still. So Statue and Pillar are numerically distinct but share the concrete property 'being constituted by Chunk'.

Constitutionalism is controversial. Material constitution as defined by 1-4 entails that two material objects can be in the same place at the same time. It also distinguishes between Paper and Bill in the case of the U.S. dollar. So if there are N U.S. dollars and the government drops them as legal tender, there will be N Papers but zero dollars, a loss of N dollars without anything being physically altered. If Germany and Mexico each license N Papers as marks and pesos, there are then three times N items when we started but later only two times N, again with no physical alteration. The co-location of material objects and the fiating of material objects out of and into existence without materially altering the relevant objects are problems for typical versions of Constitutionalism.

Tropes seem to come in at least three types: quality tropes ('being red'), relation tropes ('being above'), and "stuff" tropes ('being marble'). Hasker's example of a shared trope is a "stuff" trope. If the example is to be extrapolated to heaven, then the divine essence must be a "stuff" trope. What "stuff" can it be?

The question "Of what is it made?" is sometimes taken to be fatal for mind-body dualism on the grounds that there is no plausible answer. I heard a discussion once in which the possible answers were "ectoplasm" and "Casper the friendly ghost stuff", a dismissive way of dealing with dualism. But the question is misplaced. Consider a simple material particle (suppose there is one). Of what is it made? "Matter" is not an informative answer. The question should be "What properties has it?" The same holds for minds. Material particles and minds are simples. Regarding "stuff", God seems also to be simple (What are the parts of divine "stuff"?). If so, the question "What is God made of?" is the wrong question. But then the right question is "What properties does God have?" "Stuff" tropes are answers to "What is God made of?" Quality and relation tropes are answers to "What properties does God have?" If this is right, then the statue-pillar example is of the wrong sort for application to the Trinity, even for a Constitutionalist. But the "stuff" notion of the divine essence is presupposed by Hasker's view. Only given it can the idea of a concrete shared essence make sense from a Constitutionalist perspective.

If one is a Constitutionalist about God, one must hold that 4* is satisfied: "We are asking, is it consistent with the concept of the divine nature that it should exist at some time or other without sustaining the existence of any divine trinitarian person? It seems to me that the answer is Yes" (244). This is to be contrasted with: "it arguably is conceptually impossible for the divine nature to exist at some time without sustaining the existence of any divine person at that time" (244). Given this point, Hasker concludes that: "So it seems that the definition of constitution is satisfied in this case" (244).That is, since there might be a God who was not trinitarian, the application of Constitutionalism to the doctrine of the Trinity is successful. The price of applying Constitutionalism to God is holding that the divine essence might "some time or other" -- and if some time or other, why not always? -- exist without the Trinity existing! This is surely not part of the traditional concept of the Trinity, or indeed any satisfactory statement of trinitarian doctrine.

On the begetting and proceeding doctrines, it is the nature of the Father to cause the Son and Holy Spirit. On co-dependence doctrine, it is the nature of each Person to depend for existence on the other two. So a God who was not trinitarian could not be any of the trinitarian Persons. It will not do to say that perhaps the divine essence 'supports' one personal God at one time and then three divine Persons at another. Begetting and proceeding have the Father causing the Son eternally or everlastingly, and co-dependence doctrine has the Persons co-depending eternally or everlastingly. These are claims about the essence of God -- about properties that the Persons have necessarily, and since the essence of God is trinitarian on these views, a 'concept of God' on which 4* is true is inherently non-Christian. One might argue that Constitutionalism applies nicely to a unitarian concept of God. Being no Constitutionalist, I doubt it, but even if it does there is nothing there in aid of trinitarian doctrine. It is hard to see how applying Constitutionalism to a concept of God on which it is at best a contingent fact that God is a Trinity, and a necessary truth that each trinitarian Person might have failed to exist, shows that the idea that each Person shares the same the same concrete essence is logically consistent.

Hasker adds: "I admit, nevertheless, that the application of the constitution relation to the Trinity would go more smoothly were no such modification required" (244). If the above remarks are correct, the application's basic problem lies much deeper.

If I may sum up my point: on a trinitarian concept of God, it is God's nature to be trinitarian. Given that concept, it is not possible (assuming there is a divine essence composed of "stuff") that the divine essence 'support' just one person. Since necessarily each trinitarian Person exists if and only if the others do, given 4*, Constitutionalism cannot apply to a trinitarian God. (Parenthetically, this necessary connection between trinitarian Persons holds whether or not God enjoys the sort of existence the ontological argument requires.) How things go with regard to non-trinitarian concepts of God is irrelevant to showing that a trinitarian concept of God on which the Persons share a single concrete divine nature is anything other than self-contradictory.

 So far as I can see we have an argument for the irrationality of holding that Constitutionalism applies to the Trinity.[3] The argument goes as follows:

1. If we know that a proposition is conceptually necessarily false, it is not rational for us to accept it.

2. We know that it is conceptually necessarily false that Constitutionalism applies to a trinitarian concept of God.


3. It is not rational for us to accept that Constitutionalism applies to a trinitarian concept of God.

(I assume that any concept that is a trinitarian concept of God entails that it is logically impossible that one trinitarian Person exist and the others not exist.)

Perhaps a further look at Hasker's modal conceptualism will remove or lessen the problem. The success of the overall enterprise relies, among other things, on the account of necessity that is presupposed.

Elsewhere, Hasker characterizes his view of necessity as standing between two extremes.[4] One is Richard Swinburne's perspective:

the nominalist . . . believes that the only truths at stake concern . . . words. There is . . . no timeless realm of statements and logical necessity but just facts about how humans use language[5]

It differs from the modal realism of Plantinga.[6] Modal realism grounds necessity (human) mind-independently in either abstract objects or the mind of God. Hasker's view is: "modal conceptualism that denies that logical necessity and possibility pertain to the mind-independent world . . . . (they) pertain to concepts . . . ways it is possible for a mind to grasp and classify the world and its contents."[7]

Nonetheless, for Hasker concepts exist in worlds without minds. Since conceptualism is described briefly and not defended against modal realism beyond Hasker finding the latter mysterious, it is hard to be confident what to say about it. Are we to read it as entailing, not that concepts are necessary entities, but that we simply cannot but think of them as such? Is it mind-independently true that the divine essence (if in Hasker's sense there is any such thing) necessarily 'supports' the Trinity, although it looks to us as if it need not do so? In any case, a great gulf is fixed between conceptual necessity and the fundamental structure of reality. The stiff winds of Königsberg blow strongly through Huntington.

[1] See Gerald L. Bray, The Doctrine of God (Downer's Grove: Intervarsity Press) for a brief discussion of the relevance of Neo-Platonism.

[2] This translation of Summa Theologiae Ia.39.5 ad 2.245a is provided by Brian Leftow in "A Latin Trinity", Faith and Philosophy 21/3 (July 2004), 305.

[3] At least any version of Constitutionalism that contains 4*.

[4] "Analytic Philosophy of Religion," The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Religion (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005), 421-446.

[5] The Christian God (Oxford: Clarendon Press: 1994), 105-106.

[6] The Nature of Necessity (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974).

[7] "Analytic Philosophy of Religion," 439.