Metaphysics: Aristotelian, Scholastic, Analytic

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Lukáš Novák, Daniel D. Novotný, Prokop Sousedík, and David Svoboda (eds.), Metaphysics: Aristotelian, Scholastic, Analytic, Ontos Verlag in Cooperation with Studia Neoaristotelica, 2012, 283pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381467.

Reviewed by Timothy Pawl, The University of St. Thomas, Minnesota


This book contains the proceedings of a conference held in 2010 in Prague. It is composed of fifteen essays subsumed under six headings: Categories and Beyond, Metaphysical Structure, Substance and Accident, Existence, Modalities, and Predication.

This type of book is very useful. The Scholastics worked out intricate theories of many metaphysical topics in light of the theological beliefs many of them shared and were attempting to understand. For instance, they had careful and subtle theories of properties due to their acceptance of the Catholic doctrine of transubstantiation. They had nuanced theories of relations due to a common view of the nature of the persons in the Trinity. They had detailed accounts of how truth depends on reality, formed in part due to reflection on the nature of the mind of God. They had worked out theories of lacks or absences, and whether they could be truthmakers for negative existentials, which grew from reflection on the creative power of God. Furthermore, especially among the later scholastics, these arguments and theses are put forward with analytic rigor that rivals the contemporary metaphysical literature.

Given this overlap of both matter and form, one would expect much interplay between the analytic and scholastic traditions. But there is hardly any. I welcome this book as working toward that interplay between the two traditions, and in fact achieving it well in some instances. I do not have space to discuss each chapter in depth. Rather, in what follows, I will briefly discuss the content of each chapter, and give a fuller discussion of a few choice articles.

The book begins with Peter van Inwagen's article, "What is an Ontological Category?". The answer to his titular question is built from the following terms:

A natural class: "For any class, if its boundary marks a real division among things, then either that class or its complement is a natural class -- but not necessarily both" (15).

A large natural class: A natural "class whose membership comprises a really significant proportion of the things that there are" (17).

A high natural class: "a natural class is 'high' if it is not a proper subclass of any natural class" (18).

With these terms so understood, van Inwagen defines a primary ontological category:

"a natural class x is a primary ontological category just in the case that there are large natural classes and x is a high natural class" (18)

and a secondary ontological category:

"a natural class x is a secondary ontological category if there is a primary ontological category y such that y has large natural proper subclasses [and] x is a high subclass of y" (19).

Definitions of further n-ary ontological categories follow a structure similar to that of secondary ontological categories. And, finally, the answer comes:

An ontological category: "a class that, for some n, is an n-ary ontological category" (19).

As is usual, van Inwagen's precision, talent with prose, and humor are on display in this article.

Daniel D. Novotný's article, "Scholastic Debates about Beings of Reason and Contemporary Analytic Metaphysics," has as its aim "to take the first step toward making scholastic discussions and concerns somewhat more intelligible to contemporary analytical metaphysicians" (37). In my estimation, he succeeds. Novotný presents the ontological framework of those scholastics debating the ontology of beings of reason. He then discusses how this framework influences their debates, focusing primarily, but not exclusively, on the problem of intentionality.

In "What is Constituent Ontology?", Michael Loux claims that a constituent ontology is one in which

the privileged bearers of character are immanent in familiar sensible particulars, immanent in the sense of being something like parts, components, or ingredients of familiar particulars, and a familiar particular has the various forms of character it does because it has the appropriate underived bearers of character as parts, components, or ingredients (44).

Aristotle was a main historical proponent of constituent ontology. Loux discusses three varieties of constituent ontology: trope theory, bundle theory, and substratum theory. He raises multiple objections to constituent ontology, considering, in some cases, potential answers the constituent ontologist could supply. He considers and ultimately finds unsatisfactory the objection that constituent ontology rests upon a category mistake; namely, the mistake of taking abstracta to be parts of concreta (48). In setting up his own objections, he claims that constituent ontologists are required to affirm, as a "framework principle,"

Constituent Essentialism: where x is an ordinary object composed of a plurality of objects, a . . . n, "the resulting whole, x, has necessarily the property of having all and only a . . . n as constituents" (52).

Given Constituent Essentialism, says Loux, constituent ontologists cannot account for either change across time or modal difference across worlds (53-54). In addition, constituent ontology entails that all properties of familiar particular objects are essential to them (54). He raises objections to the three varieties of constituent ontology in particular as well. Loux ends his article with a call for constituent ontologists to consider these objections and an ominous, "Let's see how they fare" (56).

For my part, I have trouble seeing why the constituent ontologist must accept Constituent Essentialism. Why couldn't the constituent ontologist claim that some constituents -- for instance, the hylomorphic compounds of substantial form and matter, or perhaps the substantial form alone -- are privileged? In that case, she could say that Fido the dog is composed of form and matter, which are privileged, and a bunch of accidents (or tropes, or what have you) that are not privileged. Fido necessarily has the privileged objects, whatever they turn out to be on a given theory, but does not necessarily have the non-privileged ones. Temporal change and modal difference could then be explained as sameness of privileged parts but difference in non-privileged parts. Privileged parts could be essential; non-privileged parts accidental.

Anne Siebels Peterson, in her article, "Elemental Transformation in Aristotle: Three Dilemmas for the Traditional Account," argues that "the traditional [Aristotelian] account [of elemental transformation] is far more theory-laden than it is often taken to be" (71). She provides three carefully formulated and clear arguments for the conclusion that the traditional account is inconsistent with other doctrines often ascribed to Aristotle: essentialism, actualism, and the affirmation of a constituent ontology. The traditional account includes the claim that "in any case of elemental transformation, the prime matter of the pre-existent element must persist as the substratum of the newly generated element" (62). A necessary condition of one and the same thing persisting is that numerically the same thing persist. In the interest of space I will present jus the first two of these arguments.

Aristotelian essentialism is the thesis that "for any x, if x lacks an essence, then x is not a genuine being" (62). Prime matter lacks an essence, so, given Aristotelian essentialism, prime matter is not a genuine being. A necessary condition for numerical identity across time is being a genuine being. But then prime matter cannot persist through elemental transformation, contrary to the traditional account.

Aristotelian Actualism is the thesis that "something must be actual to be at all" (64). Prime matter is actual, but it is only actual accidentally: "taken by itself, apart from any merely accidental properties, prime matter will lack any actuality whatsoever -- it will be pure potentiality" (64). But it is prime matter, taken by itself, apart from any merely accidental properties, which is supposed to persist as a substratum across elemental transformation. And so something which lacks a necessary condition for existence at all persists as a substratum. But nothing can persist as a substratum and fail to exist. Thus, given actualism, the traditional view is precluded.

Ross Inman's article, "Essential Dependences, Truthmaking, and Mereology: Then and Now," offers a careful presentation of the notions of truthmaking and essential dependence, from both an analytic and a scholastic perspective. This chapter does an especially good job of working through these concepts in both traditions. It also excels at drawing the scholastic views out of the theological discussions that I mentioned earlier, e.g., discussions of transubstantiation.

In the third section, Substance and Accident, E.J. Lowe offers a brief and helpful introduction to his four-category ontology in "Essence and Ontology," He then presents a non-modalized view of essences, which, together with the four-category ontology, yields a metaphysic of modality. The heart of the view is this:

A metaphysically necessary truth: "A metaphysically necessary truth is a truth that is either an essential truth or else a truth that obtains in virtue of the essences of two or more distinct things" (107).

Essences, on this view, are "what is expressed by a real definition" (110).

Lukáš Novák provides a dense but clearly argued contribution,"An Aristotelian Argument Against Bare Particulars," where he argues "against the thesis that particulars do not have any (non-trivial) de re necessary properties" (113). He argues that some particulars -- property instances -- are essentially different from one another. Property instances (e.g., tropes or accidental forms) are necessary for an ontology because they account for accidental change (116-119). And he argues that property instances essentially differ from one another by way of showing that the denial of that claim leads to an infinite regress (119-120). Were, say, courage and knowledge tropes (not essentially but) accidentally different than one another, there would need to be further accidents that differentiate them. But then those differentiating accidents themselves would accidentally be differentiating accidents. And so they, too, would need accidents to make them so, and so on. Therefore, Novák concludes, there are particulars that are essentially different. If he is right, then, he claims, the burden of proof shifts. For now the essentialist has shown there to be essential differences between entities. The bare particularist needs to show why it is that, while some things have such differences, substances do not (120).

Finally in the third section, in their "The Ontology of Number: Is Number an Accident?", Prokop Sousedík and David Svoboda consider multiple alternative ontologies of number. They begin with the assumption that anything that exists will either be a substance (ens in se) or an accident (ens in alio). They argue that each of these theories of number falls into grave difficulties. The authors propose a modified understanding of substance and accident. They conclude:

If we modify the meaning of the Peripatetic concept[s] substance (ens in se) and accident (ens in alio), we could say that a system that is ordered by the relation of more and fewer is a 'substance,' and objects which are produced by these relations are its 'accidents' (139).

The idea here, as the authors say in their abstract, is that "from the logical point of view number is an object but from the ontological point of view it is an entity that depends on linguistic structure (ens in alio)" (123).

The fourth section, on existence, begins with an article by Edward Feser, "Existential Inertia," in which he argues that the Five Ways of Aquinas can be understood either to be, or to imply, arguments in favor of the Doctrine of Divine Conservation (DDC) over the Doctrine of Existential Inertia (DEI). DDC is the thesis that "things that God has created could not continue in existence for an instant if He were not actively preserving them in being" (143). DEI is the thesis that "the world of contingent things, once it exists, will tend to continue in existence on its own at least until something positively acts to destroy it" (143-144). Feser says that while the proponents of DEI claim that the DDCists have not provided sufficient argumentation for DDC, one can read the Five Ways as implying DDC. These arguments gleaned from the Five Ways, says Feser, are serious arguments that have not been answered by defenders of DEI (166).

Gyula Klima's "Aquinas vs. Buridan on Essence and Existence, and the Commensurability of Paradigms" is a careful analysis of three arguments against Aquinas's intellectus essentiae argument for the real distinction, at least in some cases, between a thing's essence and its existence. The intellectus essentiae argument runs as follows: we can understand the essence of a thing without understanding the existence of a thing; therefore, the existence of a thing must be distinct from its essence. Again, I will limit my presentation to two arguments.

The first objection that Klima considers is from Anthony Kenny. According to Klima, Kenny provides a proof by cases. Either Aquinas meant the Fregean existential quantifier by "existence" or he meant "existence in the sense of 'individual being', meaning actuality, corresponding to the Fregean notion of Wirklichkeit" (171). In neither case, Kenny argues, is the argument sound. Klima responds by claiming that neither reading is the right reading of existence for Aquinas.

The second objection is from John Buridan, who argued that this sort of inference is not valid in intensional contexts (a response to Leibniz's Law arguments well known in the contemporary literature). The Thomistic response Klima offers is that Buridan's retort is correct in cases where the two acts of cognition (e.g., knowing the essence of a thing and knowing the existence of a thing) are logically independent; but, if they are logically dependent, then the retort fails.

The section on modalities begins with an article by Edmund Runggaldier, SJ, "Potency in Scholasticism (potentiae) and the Contemporary Debate on 'Powers',", in which Runggaldier clarifies some common scholastic concepts concerning modality.

Subjective Potencies: "dispositions and powers inherent to a subject or bearer" (187).

Objective Potencies: "potentialities as mere possibilities" (188).

First Act: The realization of an objective potency, say, the coming into existence of a substance.

Second Act: The realization of a subjective potency, say, an existing substance's beginning to act or operate in a certain way.

Active Power: "the capacity to act actively" (188).

Passive Power: "the capacity to be affected or to receive something" (188).

I appreciate the article and its clear presentation of scholastic concepts. That said, I have a small criticism of it. The article seeks to speak for scholasticism, but only cites Aquinas and Suarez, and very little from either. The discussion of Aquinas's texts focuses on one passage from his Disputed Questions on the Power of God, and multiple passages from his Commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics. The two passages from Suarez both come from the same section of Disputation 17. This is too small an evidential base.

David Peroutka's article, "Dispositional Necessity and Ontological Possibility", offers "an account of ontological possibility, i.e., possibility founded not only on logical non-contradiction, but also on causal powers, dispositions or potencies" (195). Early on Peroutka explains ontological possibility as follows:

Ontological Possibility 1:"something is ontologically possible if there are active and passive causal capacities enabling its production (which happens either immediately or as a result of a causal chain)" (195).

There are active and passive causal capacities to bring about new substances, and also to destroy existing substances. My parents had active and passible causal capacities to produce another child, though I am an only child; my grandfather and father had active and passive causal capacities to enable the production of my father's death as an infant. And so, on this understanding of Ontological Possibility, it is ontologically possible that someone exist who does not, in fact, exist (e.g., a sister for me), or that someone not exist who in fact, exists (e.g., me, had my grandfather actuated some of his active capacities on my father). This seems right. An ontological analysis of possibility should allow for the possible existence of substances that do not actually exist, and also for the possible non-existence of some existing substances.

Later, when spelling out the concept more fully, Peroutka defines ontological possibility in this manner, where the variable ranges over individuals:

Ontological Possibility 2:"x is possible in the world w iff there is some possible world causally accessible from w in which x exists" (205).

The notion of "causal accessibility" plays an important role here. Peroutka provides two necessary conditions for world y's being causally accessible from world x, of which one is important for my purposes:

The first condition: "x and y differ from one another just (only) by some causal process or processes" (205).

Given this first condition, and the definition of Ontological Possibility 2, it follows that no situation in which there are different substances than there actually are is ontologically possible. Here's why. No substance is a causal process. And so, by the first condition, if two worlds differ with respect to a substance -- if one contains a substance the other does not -- then the worlds fail a necessary condition for causal accessibility. So no world in which, say, I have a sister, is a world causally accessible to this world. But then, given Ontological Possibility 2, it is not ontologically possible, contra Ontological Possibility 1, that I have a sister. Likewise, if there are particularized properties -- for instance, tropes -- then no world in which one of the actually existing particularized properties fails to exist is a world causally accessible from our world. And so no such situation is ontologically possible 2 from our world. Thus, not only is a sister not ontologically possible, my not typing this right now is also not ontologically possible.

Mark Faller's contribution, "The Optimal and the Necessary in Leibniz' Mathematical Framing of the Compossible," is out of place in this work. First, its focus is not analytic, scholastic or Aristotelian metaphysics. It is on Leibniz's view of necessity. Also, its style does not fit with the other articles. The argument is difficult to follow, and culminates in a discussion of the thermodynamic origins of musical harmonies (section 5.1).

The sixth, and final, section, Predication, begins with an excellent article by Uwe Meixner, "The Interpretation(s) of Predication." Meixner discusses multiple theories of prediction: that of social conventionalism (231); those of Plato (232), Aristotle (235), Aquinas (237-238), Leibniz (240), and Frege (242); set-theoretic theory (243), a minimally Aristotelian view (244), a redundancy theory (244), an identity theory (244), and a fact-referring functional predication theory (245). Meixner considers problems for each theory, covering ground quickly but carefully. His considered view is the fact-referring functional predication theory. Though he defines it formally, quoting his examples will make the view sufficiently clear without the need to define multiple technical terms.

"Kate is a woman" is true: "this amounts, ontologically, to the following: the completion of the woman-property (i.e., the property of being a woman) by Kate is a fact, or in other words: Kate has the property of being a woman" (245).

"George loves Kate" is true: "this amounts, ontologically, to the following: the completion of the love-relation (i.e., the relation of love) by <George, Kate> is a fact, or in other words: George stands in the relation of love to Kate" (245).

Meixner argues that this theory, unlike the others, can both adequately explain relational predications and also provide a helpful explanation for why predications are true.

In the final article of the book, "Towards a Thomistic Theory of Predication" Stanislav Sousedík, presents and defends an identity theory of predication, based upon the work of Aquinas. The paper begins with seven observations concerning predication, traits, and individuals. It then builds a theory that explains those observations. The theory itself rests upon Thomistic theories of distinction, essence, metaphysical parthood, and identity. The theory requires the existence of negative facts to account for the truth-value of true negative existentials. This is a surprising ontological addition for a Thomistic theory of predication. This paper is illuminating but very dense. Its prose is terse to the point of being choppy.

Despite numerous spelling and grammatical mistakes throughout the book, I find it a welcome and worthy contribution to the project of bridging the gulf between analytic and scholastic philosophy.