Metaphysics: Book Iota

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Aristotle, Metaphysics: Book Iota, Laura M. Castelli (tr., intro., comm.), Oxford University Press, 2018, xlv + 292pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682980.

Reviewed by Ian McCready-Flora, University of Virginia


Does being one thing amount to anything over and above just being? Is there a principle of oneness, something essentially one that accounts for everything else's being one? Aristotle's sensible answer to the latter, at least, is "no," pace Platonists and Pythagoreans. The case parallels that of the good, which (as he argues in Nicomachean Ethics 1.6) exists in every category despite there being no unique, category-transcendent good-maker. What makes this an opportune moment and Socrates a good man cannot be one and the same Good. Similarly, one and the same one cannot inhabit substance, quantity, quality, etc. Rather, as he says, "the one in colours, at any rate, is a colour, e.g. the white" (I 2, 1053b29). None of this precludes, though, a general account of what makes something the one for any given kind.

Aristotle develops this general account in book Iota of the Metaphysics. His answer is striking and philosophically rich: to be one is, above all, to be the primary measure of a given genus, which leads him to examine what makes something a measure and what it is to measure something. By Chapter 3, consideration of the one and its opposition to the many opens a wide-ranging inquiry into contraries, sameness, difference, similarity and privation (possession and complete privation of a property being what he calls the prime contrariety). This all comes wrapped in dense and often frustrating argumentation that defies simple summary. Iota is all we have about contraries and contradiction as ontological issues (as opposed to, say, contradiction between thoughts and statements), and the only place where Aristotle really discusses measurement. It uniquely foregrounds quantity and quality, while the rest of the Metaphysics is explicitly an inquiry into substance. He treats unity, sameness, difference and privation elsewhere, but things get weird in Iota. All of which is to say it more than deserves this Clarendon Aristotle treatment by Laura Castelli, who maintains a longstanding scholarly engagement with Iota and its questions.

Each book in the Clarendon Aristotle series (currently helmed by Lindsay Judson) offers an updated translation of an Aristotelian text, together with a synoptic introduction and line-by-line commentary. Castelli's commentary feels on some occasions redundant to a reader fresh from the translation, where each paragraph corresponds to a chunk of commentary to facilitate just such a back-and-forth. More often, though, lucid formulation and canny framing deepen the philosophical experience. I noted, while reading this part of the Metaphysics "again for the first time," every passage that brought me up short. I nearly always found Castelli addressing the very thing that had bothered me: nothing seemed to get by her. Often her treatment set me at ease or at least offered a path to understanding. This holds even when she invites disagreement and leaves questions hanging (see below, e.g., on indivisibility of thought).

She also cites a great deal of secondary literature. Those curious about contrariety and its application to genera and specific differences will find most everything of note in her valuable bibliography. Matters psychological or epistemic, on the other hand, get next to nothing. Those cases are extreme: on most topics Castelli finds expedient middle ground with a brief trailhead into the topics and light bibliographic touch. I profited from her comments on Aristotle's musical examples (pp. 56-8); how his approach to contrariety shows the influence of Pythagorean sustoichia, which organizes features of the world into a table of value-laden contrary principles (pp. 110, 118-9); and her subtle reconstruction of an argument in the closing chapter (pp. 248-52) that perishable and imperishable things differ in genus given that they are contrary and contraries differ in species, an inference that, before I reached the commentary, seemed a blatant non sequitur. Castelli has, in short, given us a valuable piece of scholarship. It belongs on anyone's shelf who writes or teaches on the Metaphysics, Aristotle's treatment of species and genera, or his reception of Plato and the Pythagoreans. As I said above, Iota gets strange and Castelli proves an able guide to its ins and outs.

The translation (from Ross' 1924 critical edition, still the most recent) is crisp and accurate, promoting engagement with Aristotle's difficult reasoning. Castelli departs from Ross' text in a number of places and remarks on prominent alternative readings even when she keeps Ross's text. I am a dilettante when it comes to textual criticism, but her changes never seem tendentious or unmotivated. The commentary fails to sustain the translation's crisp readability. Terms like "ontological determination" and "polyadic unity in account" appear unexplained and unconnected to Aristotle's Greek; the prose is workmanlike, full of long periods spooling out arrhythmically. More thought might have been given to the reader's experience. Revising every occurrence of "it is not [entirely/completely/immediately] [clear/obvious] [whether/that/how] . . . " would help, as would honing "problematic" (a catch-all too freely deployed) into something more perspicuous.

Reading cover to cover is not, of course, the best use of a commentary: volumes like this shine ad hoc and ad loc. A similar trudging rhythm, though, creeps into sections meant to be taken whole. Castelli aims for comprehensiveness, introducing and at least partially digesting every relevant point and contribution to a given interpretive issue, and fields of alternative readings and sub-questions sprout as she proceeds. Her efforts, as I said, yield much to admire in the particulars. What proves frustrating is how rarely all the careful work yields something conclusive. Too often I ended a section startled, as if from a dream, to realize I had no answer to what the discourse had called me to consider. At the extremes, this performance of epochê can even undermine the translation (where hard choices live), as at p. 199 on the crucial phrase "other in species" (heteron tôi eidei). The relevant text likely applies (as Castelli notes) to species as well as individuals, but calling species "other in species" is a category mistake, while calling them "other in form" (the alternative) makes good sense. She keeps "other in species," though, even as she leaves relevant defeaters undefeated.

Something similarly aporetic happens when she charts out Aristotle's argument that the "difference of genus" is contrariety (pp. 208-11), an odd claim that she persuaded me means any pair of contrary properties "differentiates the genus into things that are other in species" (p. 208). The passage repays attention, drawing an insightful distinction between difference (which presupposes some respect of similarity) and mere otherness. How the argument goes, though, depends on the crucial claim that opposites yield a division of the genus. What is that supposed to mean? Castelli surveys two options but seems to discard them both. A promising analogy between the genus and the substrate that persists through physical change -- since the genus is a sort of substrate that takes species as determinants -- disappears into unanswered questions, while a more straightforward extensional reading (opposites divide the members of any genus they apply to into nonoverlapping sets) gets impeached because a "merely extensional approach does not exhaust Aristotle's view on the matter" (p. 211). So, I mean . . . what is his view on the matter? How should we take the crucial premise? Is the extensional reading good enough? These and other evenhanded but ambivalent treatments made me want to say "Well, you tell me!"

Let's conclude with a little of what is (to me) most enticing about Metaphysics Iota, namely how psychology and epistemology -- what goes on, broadly speaking, "in the head" -- shape the inquiry into oneness. Aristotle's measure-theoretic approach is one example: he addresses a metaphysical issue (the nature of the one) with epistemic constructs (measures, defined at 1052b25 as "the primary thing through which each [quantity and quality] is known"). Just as striking, though, is how he hangs the oneness of a thing on the unity of our thoughts about it. Aristotle first offers oneness of thought in a preliminary list of ways things are said to be one:

Other things are one if their account (logos) is one, and things of this kind are one of which the thought (noêsis) is one; and things of this kind are those of which the thought is indivisible, and a thought is indivisible which is of what it is indivisible in form or number (I 1, 1052a28-31)

Indivisibility in number applies to individuals like Socrates, indivisibility in form to "what is indivisible in respect of what can be known (gnôstôi) and knowledge (epistêmêi)" (a31-2), which turns out to refer to universals (a35). He reaffirms this scheme when he later concludes that "being one is being indivisible, which is precisely being a this and being inseparable in place or form or thought (here dianoia, not noêsis)" (1052b15-17). Plenty of complications here: that last quote, for instance, groups inseparability in form and thought as ways of being indivisible tout court, whereas earlier at a28-31 he invokes indivisibility in form to explain indivisibility in thought. Set that aside, though, and ask what an indivisible thought is supposed to be and how facts about the composition of our thoughts might settle the ontological question.

Here I would have liked one of Castelli's informative trailheads. She says little about what thinking is and refers to passages in book 3 of the De anima (where Aristotle treats rational thought at length) that are themselves deeply obscure. To make sense of what it is to be indivisible in account, she brings up the unity of definition (pp. 34-5). That problem is real enough: how does an account that combines biped + rational + animal, and thereby denotes what it is to be human (Castelli's example), exhibit unity, while one that combines Socrates + white amounts to an "incidental compound" with no unity? The issue does not illuminate Aristotle's train of thought here, though, for being indivisible in account depends on being indivisible in thought. The semantic unity (as Castelli calls it) of certain accounts cannot be what unifies the associated thought because thoughts are about things in the world, not accounts. Since logoi derive their structure from the thoughts that employ them, it will be unity of thought that explains unity of account, not the other way around.

What, then, unifies a thought? A unified thought is an indivisible thought, which is a thought about something indivisible in form or number. There are two problems with this. First, even on Aristotle's view, there is no orderly relationship between the structure of a thing and of our thoughts about it. As Castelli points out, we can think of a line (which is always divisible) with an "indivisible act of thought," comprehending the whole magnitude (p. 37). In that sense, any given thought, in order to be about that object, must be indivisible: separation would make for a new thought about something else. We also think of objects that actually are indivisible in form (like the unmoved mover, per Castelli p. 38) with a combination of thoughts, since to think about it we must combine the notions unmoved and mover. Nor do we think about parts of objects with parts of the thoughts about them: thinking about Socrates' hand involves thoughts about hands and Socrates, not the part of the Socrates-thought that happens to be about his hand.

It remains a puzzle, then, how indivisibility of thought connects to indivisibility in form or number. Castelli concludes that "indivisibility of thought . . . ultimately rests on some basic ontological facts about unity" (p. 38). In one way, she must be right: the dependence could hardly go in the reverse direction, with ontological facts depending on thoughts, for that way lies Protagorean madness. She is furthermore right that for Aristotle "our cognitive faculties are naturally apt to grasp extra-mental ontological structures," so that "the fact that we perceive something as continuous . . . reflects some fundamental ontological facts" (p. 41). That explanation, though, leaves mysterious Aristotle's train of thought, which does hang ontological unity on unity of thought and not vice versa ("other things are one . . . of which the thought is one"), even if it then analyzes unity of thought in terms of the object's indivisibility (which is distinct, I take it, from oneness, otherwise the claim just goes in a circle).

Respond, perhaps, that this fully vindicates Castelli, since the explanation bottoms out at the ontological structure of the objects themselves. I do not think so, for though being one is being indivisible (1052b15-17), Aristotle clarifies that being indivisible depends in part on being inseparable in thought. This confronts us with the second problem: to the extent that an indivisible thought just is a thought that grasps a unified object, Aristotle's discussion becomes even more inscrutable. If thoughts mirror objects, then unity of thought explains nothing about what it is to be one. Why, then, does Aristotle even bring it up? Castelli insightfully appeals to Aristotle's distinction between what is prior with respect to us and what is prior in nature (pp. 40-41). Aristotle sometimes frames this in terms of what is clear to us vs. what is naturally so; see for instance Physics 1.1, where we start with obvious but uninformative sensory experience and proceed to elements and principles. His point either way is that the structure of the world looks different to someone with relevant knowledge. Science transforms our view of things: as he says in Metaphysics A 2, mathematical innocents wonder at how no smaller length can measure out the diagonal of a unit square, while "the geometric man would wonder at nothing so much as if the diagonal should turn out commensurable" (983a19-21, trans. mine).

Castelli rescues the appeal to thought thus: unified thoughts and accounts provide "starting points we have access to in order to undertake the enquiry into the unity of their underlying objects" (p. 40). Unity of thought is therefore a sign, not a cause, of ontological unity, which is revealed in the course of doing the science. This reading is clever and tempting, but two worries linger. First, the distinction between what is prior/familiar to us and what is prior/familiar by nature bespeaks some epistemic transformation: what is clear to the ignorant is not so to one who knows and vice versa. The intuitions of the mathematically illiterate regarding the diagonal are not vindicated, and what is clear "with respect to us" is actually by nature obscure. Aristotle never suggests, however, that unified thoughts are misleading in their unity.

The distinction moreover fits ill his measure-theoretic account of unity. Recall that indivisibility in form attaches to "what is indivisible in respect of what can be known (gnôstôi)." This is why Aristotle concludes that to be one is above all to be a first measure, which are "the primary thing[s] through which each [kind] is known (gignôsketai, from the same root as gnôstôi)." Being known requires a knower, so determining first measures means inquiry into what yields relevant knowledge to (presumably) human subjects. That inquiry is not, however, a convenient or disposable first step toward some absolute conception. Measurehood is not a sign of the one; it's what makes something the one. If that is right, then thought is after all built into the structure of unity. How and why this might be so is, of course, a further question.