Metaphysics of States of Affairs: Truthmaking, Universals, and a Farewell to Bradley’s Regress

Metaphysics Of States Of Affairs Truthmaking Universals And A Farewell

Bo R. Meinertsen, Metaphysics of States of Affairs: Truthmaking, Universals, and a Farewell to Bradley’s Regress, Springer, 2018, 174pp., $109.99 (hbk), ISBN 9789811330674.

Reviewed by Katarina Perovic, University of Iowa


Bo R. Meinertsen's monograph reopens and revisits some of the difficult problems that face a realist about universals. Realism about universals is an old view that has been around since at least Plato and Aristotle, with its most recent systematic defense in the work of Australian philosopher David Armstrong.

One of the main motivating forces for adoption of universals stems from wanting to provide an ontological ground of genuine resemblance between distinct particular things. Assuming that a red apple, a red phone box, and a red tomato genuinely resemble in respect of being red, a realist can say that what ontologically grounds resemblance in respect of redness is an entity that they all share -- viz., the universal redness. Thus, on the face of it, universals appear to unify reality in a way that rival ontologies do not. They are the "ones" that run through many resembling particulars and in this way ground genuine resemblances in the world, or as Plato famously put it, "carve nature at its joints".

For a sparse property realist, some resemblances are genuine and some are merely apparent. David Armstrong was an a posteriori scientific realist who believed that fundamental science ought to be our guide as to which resemblances are genuine and which ones are merely apparent. Thus, being in the same room would most likely not amount to a respect in which we all genuinely resemble, and thus would not pick out a universal, but being human very well might (we all have a certain type of DNA sequence, the one distinctive of homo sapiens and no other species).

Nominalists and trope theorists disagree with realists about the need to introduce universals. Though they tend to agree that genuine resemblance amongst particulars is an objective phenomenon, they claim that it does not warrant the postulation of universals. For them, there is nothing more to resemblance than primitive natural classes of resembling particulars (for class nominalists) or primitive natural classes of non-repeatable trope instances. The phenomenon needs no further explanation, according to them, and certainly needs no special entities -- universals -- to help with such explanation.

The debate between nominalists, trope theorists, and realists about universals is still an ongoing one, and a lot in this debate depends on how well each view deals with a variety of explanatory challenges. Meinertsen's contribution to the debate is meant to help realists -- and more specifically immanent realists of Armstrong's stamp -- make their case, by focusing on addressing and solving some of the problems that plague their theory. Central among these is the problem of unity of states of affairs and issues concerning what ontological status the states of affairs and their constituent entities ought to have.

Like Armstrong, Meinertsen believes that we should admit states of affairs as truthmakers for statements about particulars having properties and standing in relations to other particulars. The thought here is simply that what makes true the statement "This tomato is red" is not just the particular tomato by itself, for it could be some other color such as yellow or orange or green; nor is it the universal property of redness by itself, for the universal redness is present in many different red things. What makes the whole statement true is this particular state of affairs of this particular tomato being red. Such a state of affairs seems to possess a peculiar type of unity -- it is more than just a particular thing and the universal; it is those entities unified together in some special way.

So Meinertsen, like Armstrong, argues that states of affairs are better candidates for the truthmaking job of these kinds of statements than their rivals. In part I of the book, Meinertsen carefully presents but ultimately rejects both Keith Campbell's simple bundle trope theory which takes ordinary particulars to be bundles of tropes (the red tomato just is a bundle of its particular redness, juiciness, roundness, and so on), as well as Donald Mertz's moderate realism which appeals to relation instances. The main objection to both of these theories of properties is that they do not solve the problem of unity in a sufficiently convincing way. Meinertsen discusses in more detail what he thinks a good solution to the problem of unity should look like in the final chapters of his book (chs. 9 and 10), but it would have been useful for the reader to have had the desiderata for a good solution to the problem spelled out, motivated, and argued for earlier in the book, especially if the central criticisms of the rival theories rest on their not meeting them.

In part II of the monograph, Meinertsen takes a closer look at the constituents of states of affairs. He spends a chapter on each of the following: bare particulars, properties, relations, and concrete universals. For him, the particulars that are constituents of states of affairs have to be bare particulars, or particulars with properties "stripped away". Think of the red tomato from the example above -- a bare particular would presumably be the tomato without its properties of redness, juiciness, roundness, etc.; it is a bare property-less something that is the bearer of all the properties that give it its character. An odd entity, by any standard. Well, whereas Armstrong fell short of fully endorsing bare particulars, Meinertsen argues that bare particulars should be accepted in their role as instantiators of properties and individuators of thick particulars. How exactly they are to perform these roles, especially the individuating one, given that they are entirely stripped of properties and thus interchangeable, is not something that Meinertsen explains further; we are to take bare particulars as entities that simply can and do fulfill these roles.

When it comes to properties, Meinertsen argues against disjunctive (e.g., being red or green), negative (e.g., not being human), conjunctive (e.g, being circle and round), and unique qualitative properties (e.g., being the last dodo) as candidates for genuine universals which constitute states of affairs. Most of the arguments against such properties counting as universals are already familiar from Armstrong -- they do not ground resemblance between particulars, they do not add to causal efficacy of the particular instantiating them, or they are simply uneconomical ontological additions. However, Meinertsen departs from Armstrong when it comes to conjunctive properties -- unlike Armstrong, who believed that conjunctive properties could be treated as universals (especially the structural ones), Meinertsen thinks that they too are nothing over and above their constitutive conjuncts. Here he sides with Hugh Mellor over Armstrong; Mellor and Meinertsen both rightly find Armstrong's argument from the possibility of infinite complexity of nature to the need to postulate conjunctive universals, to be uncompelling. As to relations, Meinertsen makes a distinction between internal, external, and grounded relations and argues, unsurprisingly, that only external relations are irreducible and should therefore be considered as entities in their own right.

Part III of the monograph is the place where Meinertsen gives his most original contribution. This is where he argues for his own solution to the problem of unity of states of affairs and its advantage over rival theories. States of affairs are complex entities, constituted out of particulars and universals -- for example, a being F is a monadic state of affairs, a standing in a relation R to b is a dyadic relational state of affairs, and so on. Quoting Mertz, Meinertsen raises "the problem of complexity" for states of affairs: in a state of affairs, there are many entities united into one, but what grounds the unity of such complexes? What is it that unifies states of affairs' constituents into a complex whole?

Here, Meinertsen highlights two broad strategies for replying to this challenge: the first "externalist" one appeals to an entity, usually a relation, that is outside of the state of affairs itself, but does the unifying job for it. The second "internalist" one appeals to an entity that is internal to the state of affairs to do the unifying of the constituents of states of affairs. His own proposal is of the latter -- "internalist" -- kind, as he believes that a special relation U, which is a constituent of the state of affairs, is the sort of entity that unites the constituents of a states of affairs into a complex.

The next question that Meinertsen wants to address is: How does U relate its relata? Saying simply that the ontological role of a relation is to relate is not a good enough answer for him. We need to know more about how the job gets done; we need to know the mechanics of relating. To this end, Meinertsen then offers his own unique solution: what unifies states of affairs is a special relation U* which relates the constituents of states of affairs by relating itself to those constituents. This way, Meinertsen takes himself to have addressed the "how do relations relate" question (thanks to the self-relating capacity of the U* relation) while at the same time avoiding the Bradley-type regress (since no additional relations are necessary for the accomplishment of the relating task and the regress of relations does not get started).

He claims that self-relating occurs "when a relation has itself as one of its relata" (p. 158). This way we have one relation U* occurring in two roles in each state of affairs -- it occurs as the relating relation and as a relatum, along with other constituents of states of affairs. The state of affairs of a being F is actually U*(U*, a, F) and the state of affairs of aRb is actually U*(U*, a, R, b). This is evocative of Russell's talk of relations having dual nature -- of being able to occur as terms of relations as well as relating relations. The trouble with such dual roles is to explain, as Bradley famously asked Russell, "What is the difference between a relation which relates in fact and one which does not so relate?" (Bradley 1911: 74). Or, for Meinertsen: What is the difference between a relation occurring in its passive role, as a relatum, and it occurring in its active role, as a relating relation? He would probably reply that this duality of roles is simply what this self-relating capacity of the U* relation comes down to; there is no more to explain. But if this is the best answer that one can give, it's hard not to wonder how an introduction of such a curious relation, with its dual nature exhibited on the same occasion, can be considered as an improvement upon a view that takes it that relations simply relate their relata. For it is not that U* relates in one state of affairs and doesn't relate in another, thus behaving differently in different contexts; it is on the very same occasion -- in the very same state of affairs -- that U* is both relating and being related, or, to put it more harshly: it is both relating and not relating at the very same time.

Meinertsen adds that U* should be thought of as an external relation without a specific adicity, since it relates different numbers of relata on different occasions. He suggests that we think of U* as a determinable with a general feature of "having some specific adicity" in analogy to a determinable being colored. This, he believes, will help maintain ontological economy: multiple different U* relations can be considered as species of the genus U*- relation and "only the genus is an ontological category included in our ontological bookkeeping" (p. 159).

But this, too, is a bit unclear: firstly, genus/species relationship does not map on neatly to determinable/determinate relationship; secondly, it is not clear what exactly is meant by "ontological bookkeeping", i.e., whether Meinertsen is interested in conceptual or ontological economy here. The choice of determinable being colored is also confusing, since many authors would not want to consider this as a genuine universal, and would only admit particular determinate color hues in their ontology (the thought is that being colored cuts the nature at the joints much more indiscriminately than, say, being crimson).

To be fair, nothing much hangs on this last point. Overall, the book goes over a lot of familiar territory and engages, albeit often very briefly and superficially, with many prominent scholars in the field. It is well researched and a good source for references. But the author, rather than presenting the issues and problems in his own authentic philosophical voice, is too often content merely to side with one well-known philosopher or argument over another. It would have been nice to see those positions a bit more thoroughly examined and engaged with.