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Aristotle, Metaphysics, C. D. C. Reeve (tr.), Hackett, 2016, 652pp., $29.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781624664397.

Reviewed by Matthew Duncombe, University of Nottingham





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The treatise we know as Aristotle's Metaphysics is central to both teaching and researching Aristotle. Hackett produces useable, affordable translations of ancient texts, aimed primarily at teachers and learners and secondarily at researchers. This text is in that tradition (p. xviii). The price point is higher than some student texts, but still reasonable if this were the main text for a course on Aristotle. Generally, C. D. C. Reeve manages the competing demands of these two audiences well, particularly when it comes to the translation.

In this review, first, I mention some existing English translations of Aristotle's Metaphysics. Second, I describe the structure and content of Reeve's version. Third, I discuss the character of Reeve's notes, which are the primary apparatus he uses to guide us through the Metaphysics in his translation. Fourth, to show the merits of Reeve's approach, I comment in detail on his translation and discussion of Metaphysics Zeta.

Existing Translations

Several English translations of the whole Metaphysics are already available. Maybe the most widely used are W. D. Ross' 1941, available in Jonathan Barnes' Complete Works, and Hugh Tredennick's 1933 for the Loeb Classical Library. There are two whole-text translations available in trade paperback: H. C. Lawson-Tancred's 1998 for Penguin and Joe Sachs' 1999 for Green Lion. Commonly used partial translations include Montgomery Furth's 1985 of books Zeta, Eta, Theta and Iota, also from Hackett. Clarendon's Aristotle series has: Arthur Madigan's Beta and Kappa 1-2; Christopher Kirwan's Gamma, Delta and Epsilon; David Bostock's Zeta and Eta; Stephen Makin's Theta; Julia Annas' Mu and Nu. Reeve often takes account of these translations and commentaries, as well as Bostock on Zeta and Eta and Michael Frede and Günther Patzig on Zeta. Below, when I compare Reeve's translation to others, I'll discuss Tredennick and Ross, the most comparable whole-text translations.

Structure and Content

Reeve introduces Aristotle's life, the project of the Metaphysics and who might have been its audience. A 250-page translation based on Werner Jaeger's 1957 Oxford Classical Texts edition follows, although Reeve frequently emends. 1644 endnotes follow, ordered sequentially. A two-page glossary, two pages of 'further reading' (no bibliography), a short index of names and a sixty-three-page index of English terms complete the book.

Reeve tells us why he makes the translation choices he does. He aims to compensate for the 'deceptive familiarity' of traditional translations without the 'alienating distance' of idiosyncratic ones (p. xvii). To do this, he aims for translations sensitive to the philosophical use of a term. But, of course, what one takes the philosophical use of a term to be depends on one's interpretation. So to evaluate Reeve's translation I have to say something about the interpretation it reflects. Below, I will use Zeta as a case study.


The notes dominate Reeve's text. He scatters superscript numbers over each page while the block of endnotes make even the paperback physically imposing. Imagine a translation typeset by David Foster Wallace. Unlike Wallace's, Reeve's end-noting is user friendly: I flipped happily back and forth without losing my place. The notes fall into five kinds: cross-references; alternative translations; textual emendations; quotations of parallel texts or ancient commentaries; philosophical explanations. Although Reeve's notes are extensive, he does not aim to provide an exhaustive commentary; rather he aims to provide a translation and explanations to help students and researchers.

Cross-references, alternative translations and emendations don't need general remarks. But I will say something about Reeve's quotations and explanations. He tends to quote comparative texts of Aristotle at length. 'Can be taught' at 980b25 provokes a long note (Note 8, p. 256), quoting Sens. 1 436b18-437a17 on perceptual capacities. This may help the student: it is useful to have such parallels at your fingertips.

Reeve's notes are a gold mine for the researcher, especially when he gives parallel texts or ancient commentary. At 1021a11-14, Aristotle offers a bafflingly compressed regress argument for the law of the excluded middle. In his Note 460 (p. 357) Reeve helpfully quotes Alexander (In. Met. 332.18-333.7, in Madigan's translation), who offers a sensible interpretation. This is a welcome contrast to Ross's commentary, which often relies on Alexander but does not help us engage with the ancient commentary tradition. Largely due to Richard Sorabji's efforts, the ancient commentary tradition plays an increasingly important role in research on Aristotle, and Reeve deploys this material admirably.

Generally, Reeve's explanations are helpful, but some miss the mark. When 'epistêmê' first crops up at 981a1-2 (Note 11, p. 257-261), he lays out the syllogistic system of Prior Analytics I, 1-7. But Reeve very much under-explains it. He gives only the first figure moods, but does not explain what 'a' 'e' 'i' 'o' signify and uses technical terms 'Camestres' and 'Cesare' without explanation. The expert does not need this but the novice will be baffled.

Book Zeta

Whether you are considering Reeve's text for teaching, research, or both, you'll be interested in his treatment of Metaphysics Book Zeta, Aristotle's discussion of substance. Book Zeta opens with the idea that there are several ways in which things are said to be, but says that one of these meanings is primary: the 'what-it-is' sense. This leads Aristotle to hold that the question 'what is being?' is just the question 'what is substance?'. In English, it is hard to see why Aristotle thinks you can simply replace the question 'what is being?' with the question 'what is substance?'. At least, the considerations in Zeta 1 don't motivate this move. But in Greek, the slide is obvious: ousia, ('substance') is simply the abstract noun formed from 'on' (being). ousia is just being in the most general aspects. To ask what ousia is, just is to ask what the most general aspect of being is. Reeve translates with the traditional 'substance' (for 'ousia') and 'being' (for 'on'). Not a misleading choice, given the translation tradition, but it shows Reeve's preference for traditional translations when it suits his needs.

The main discussions of Zeta 3-13 focus on surveying four options for what the substance of a thing is: the essence (to ti en einai), the universal (to katholou), the genus (to genos), and the underlying subject (to hupokeimenon). Zeta 3 discusses this last option. Form, matter, and the compound of the two are considered underlying subjects (1029a2-4), but which is the candidate substance? One option is 'prime matter', which Aristotle suggests as a 'thought experiment' (1029a23, Note 629, p. 402). Prime matter is not itself predicated of anything, but things are predicated of prime matter. So prime matter has no features in itself, but only has some features coincidentally. If you're the sort of thinker who wants the underlying subject of something to be the substance of something, prime matter is your candidate substance (1029a26). But Aristotle thinks that this is impossible (1029a28). Why? Reeve translates:

(T1) In fact, separability and being a this something (sic) seem to belong most of all to substance, and, because of this, the form and the thing composed of both would seem to be substance more than matter is (1029a28-30. Trans. Reeve).

The two comparable translations give:

(T1) For it is accepted that separability and individuality belong especially to substance. Hence it would seem that the form and the combination of form and matter are more truly substance than matter is (1029a28-30. Trans. Tredennick).

(T1) For both separability and individuality are thought to belong chiefly to substance. And so form and the compound of form and matter would be thought to be substance, rather than matter (1029a28-30. Trans. Ross).

Reeve's translation is superior in some respects. Ross' translation of the second sentence misleads. It gives the impression that Aristotle thinks form and the hylomorphic compound taken together are substance, whereas Reeve, like Tredennick, correctly communicates the comparative point that form and the hylomorphic compound are each more likely to be substance than matter is.

Although Tredennick and Ross translate the first sentence, a 'gar-clause' in the Greek, with 'for', Reeve differs by choosing 'in fact'. This is a significant disagreement. Most scholars think that T1 offers Aristotle's grounds for thinking that matter, including prime matter, is not substance. Although matter is separable (some bronze can exist without being a statue) and matter is particular (a lump of bronze, or a statue), matter is never both. In so far as matter is separable from form, the matter is not an individual; in so far as the bronze exists without form, it is not some individual. But substance must be separable and particular; so, matter cannot be substance.[1]

However, at odds with the usual interpretation, Reeve translates as if T1 does not offer grounds at all (Note 694, p. 403). He translates the gar as 'in fact' and takes the impossibility of prime matter being substance to have already been established at Met. Z, 1029a18-26. Is Reeve's interpretation, and so translation, correct?

He holds that Aristotle argues that it is impossible that prime matter is substance elsewhere, at T2. Aristotle imagines a chain of subjects of predication and then says:

(T2) And so the last thing [in the series] will not be intrinsically a something, or a quantity, or anything else -- nor indeed the denials of these, since they too will belong to it coincidentally (1029a24-26. Trans. Reeve).

Here are the comparators:

(T2) Thus the ultimate substrate is in itself neither a particular thing nor a quantity nor anything else. Nor indeed is it the negations of these; for the negations too will apply only to it accidentally (Trans. Tredennick).

(T2) Therefore the ultimate substratum is of itself neither a particular thing nor of a particular quality nor otherwise positively characterised; nor yet negatively, for negations also will belong to it only by accident (Trans. Ross).

Again, Reeve's translation is preferable. Both Tredennick and Ross translate using 'substrate' or 'substratum', where the Greek actually has a term meaning 'the last thing'. Although in this context 'the last thing' may refer to an ultimate substrate, 'the last thing' certainly does not mean 'substrate' or anything similar.

Although Reeve's translation is superior, the argument of T2 needs unpacking (Note 693, p. 402). The last thing in the series of subjects, prime matter, could either (a) be predicated or (b) have something predicated of it. Taking (a), prime matter could be predicated in one of two ways: intrinsically or coincidentally. But the former is impossible since nothing has prime matter as an intrinsic feature. But prime matter could be predicated coincidentally. Taking (b), prime matter cannot have intrinsic predicates, so only has coincidental predicates. But, according to Metaphysics Γ 4 (1007a33-b4), nothing has only coincidental predicates, on pain of infinite regress. So anything predicated of prime matter must be predicated of some subject with intrinsic predicates. But, Reeve thinks, that subject cannot be prime matter: if prime matter 'is not intrinsically anything, there is nothing that it intrinsically is -- nothing to which it is intrinsically identical'. So any predicates of prime matter need not belong to one and the same subject.

I'm puzzled by how Reeve thinks Aristotle's argument works. It seems false that, just because prime matter cannot be predicated intrinsically, it cannot have any intrinsic predicates. Socrates cannot be predicated intrinsically, but can have intrinsic predicates. So on Reeve's construal, Aristotle's argument is unsound. But even if it were sound, on Reeve's reading, T2 misses its target. T2 argues that prime matter is not a proper subject. But Aristotle needs an argument that prime matter is not substance. Now, if Aristotle thinks being a substance entails being a subject, T2 is relevant: a substance is subject; prime matter is not a subject; so, prime matter is not substance. But this is not how Reeve wants to read the passage: for Reeve, T2, rather than T1, is supposed to directly give the reasons that prime matter is not substance.

Here we see a different aspect of Reeve's translation strategy. In T1, Reeve used a non-standard translation of 'in fact' (for 'gar'), one which supports his interpretation of the text, in the face of the translation tradition of 'for'. Is Reeve's translation correct? Well, a 'gar' clause almost always gives the grounds for what precedes it. We would need strong reasons to favour a translation, like Reeve's, that breaks that connection. I've suggested that Reeve's interpretation does not offer strong reasons. But, in accordance with his principles, Reeve explains his translation, so we can decide for ourselves.

As Zeta continues, form emerges as the prime candidate for substance. Zeta 7-9, which deal with matter-form compounds in detail, are often thought to be a later insertion. Reeve judiciously summarises the case for and against (Note 736, p. 412). The upshot of Zeta 7-9 is that the form of a matter-form compound makes the compound what it is; whatever makes something what it is, is the essence; so, the form is the essence. Zeta 10 and Zeta 11 discuss some puzzles about how forms, essences and definitions relate, but by the end of Zeta 12 Aristotle seems to be thinking of substance as a definable form (1037a25-30) and, since universals are the candidates for definition, a substantial form is a universal. Zeta 8 1034a6-8 confirms this, by asserting that Socrates and Callias are the same in form, but different in matter. Since two individuals share the same form, the substantial form must be a universal.

But when Aristotle returns to consider universals as candidate substances in Zeta 13, he asserts that 'it seems impossible for any of the things said [of something] universally to be a substance' (1038b4-6). Aristotle's theory now seems to involve an inconsistent set of commitments: (1) all substances are forms; (2) all forms are universals; (3) no universal is a substance. I'll try to reconstruct and evaluate Reeve's approach to this notorious crux.[2]

Reeve denies that Aristotle holds (2). Some forms, the substantial forms, are not universals. Why think that Aristotle makes this move? Reeve argues this way. At the beginning of Zeta 13, Aristotle distinguishes two underlying subjects of which a universal can be predicated (1038b4-6): (1) a 'this something' (tode ti) that underlies attributes; (2) matter that underlies form. Universals apply to many underlying subjects. But the subjects that underlie universals must be 'this somethings', since matter cannot be intrinsically many things (Note 884, p. 438). So, forms are not universals because forms have matter as an underlying subject. The matter that underlies forms cannot be many things, so forms cannot belong to many things. So at least some forms are not universals. Since substances are separate and individual (T1), and substances are forms, some non-universal forms could be substantial forms.

This is confirmed because:

(T3) The substance of each thing is special to it (idios), in that it does not belong to anything else (1038b9-10. Trans. Reeve.)

T3 amounts to the assertion that if x is the substance of y, then x is special to y. To give T3, Reeve follows readings given by Frede, Patzig and Bostock, against the OCT. The OCT text would be rendered:

(T3') The substance of each thing is what is special to it, which does not belong to anything else (Trans. Reeve).

Unlike T3, T3' seems false. T3' asserts that if x is special to y, then x is the substance of y. But some special individuals are not substances. Socrates' individual pallor is special to Socrates, but Socrates' pallor is not the substance of Socrates. Again, Reeve's judgement is sound since he rightly prefers the Frede-Patzig-Bostock reading, which gives T3, and not the OCT, which gives T3'. The substantial form of x must be special to x. The substance of each thing is unique. So, on Reeve's reading, substantial forms must be unique to each thing and so are not universals.

There are some familiar problems with this sort of approach. Substances are, for Aristotle, exemplary definable entities, but non-universals are not definable; so substantial forms end up being not definable. But there is a more particular problem with Reeve's approach. His view implies that Aristotle holds that no forms are universals. If all forms have some matter underlying them and no matter is many things, then no form has many things underlying it. So no forms are universals. But this is contradicted by the Socrates and Callias example at Z8 1034a6-8. Although I'm not convinced of the interpretation he offers on this point, I am convinced that Reeve's textual emendation and translation are correct.


Reeve's emendations and translations are philosophically sensitive and he scrupulously offers the alternatives in his notes. I can't fault his translation strategy, which balances literalism and readability without sacrificing accuracy and empowers readers to evaluate his choices. The interpretive notes Reeve offers are useful, but are not intended to serve as a full commentary. They will, however, help students and provide a rich resource of inspiration for researchers. The learning, skill and range exhibited by Reeve are astonishing. In short, if you teach or research Aristotle, Reeve offers a valuable addition to the English-language resources on the Metaphysics.

[1] This reading is suggested by Cohen, S. Marc, "Aristotle's Metaphysics", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

[2] The way I set up this crux follows Cohen, S. Marc, "Aristotle's Metaphysics".