Metasemantics: New Essays on the Foundations of Meaning

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Alexis Burgess and Brett Sherman, Metasemantics: New Essays on the Foundations of Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2014, 367pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669592.

Reviewed by Derek Ball, University of St Andrews


Metasemantics is a valuable addition to the literature in philosophy of language and linguistics. The subtitle indicates that the topic is the foundations of meaning, but the essays discuss a surprisingly wide range of themes. In fact, one of the remarkable features of the collection is the level of reflective disagreement about the right foundational questions to ask: in addition to the editors' introduction, several of the essays are devoted to distinguishing and defending the significance of different metasemantic questions. I will start by describing those essays that focus in large part on questions, with an eye toward using those questions to structure the rest of the discussion.

I. Metasemantic Questions

What, then, are the metasemantic questions? In their introduction, Alexis Burgess and Brett Sherman distinguish three families of metasemantic issues: basic metasemantics (which aims to describe the grounds or metaphysical bases of semantic facts); the theory of meaning (which aims to give an account of the nature or essence of the semantic); and the metaphysics of semantic values (which addresses such questions as whether semantic values should be thought of as truth-conditions, conceptual roles, or something else).

In his contribution, Seth Yalcin distinguishes between semantic value and content. 'Content', in his terminology, has its home in folk psychological explanation of behaviour and the theory of intentionality, while 'semantic value' is a technical notion of natural language semantics, designed to explain facts about productivity, entailment, and acceptability. Meta-level questions can be asked about content and about semantic value. Yalcin casts semantic value as part of the Chomskian project of characterising the language faculty, contrasting this project with various alternative conceptions of semantics. Yalcin's view is not just that concepts of content and semantic value are distinguishable in principle; he regards it as a completely open question how (and indeed whether) semantic value relates to content. Yalcin ends with a methodological claim: we cannot be confident in our metasemantics as things stand since semantics is at an early stage of development, so the best way to make progress on metasemantic theorising is to do more work in semantics.

Someone sympathetic to the distinction between content and semantic value might see a tension between this methodology and Yalcin's seeming confidence that semantic values should be conceived of as part of a Chomskian project with no clear relevance to issues of primary concern to many or most philosophers (and at least some linguists) interested in semantics. Perhaps until we have more detailed first-order semantic theories, we should remain open to other ways of understanding what claims about semantic value are about. One of the contributions of Alejandro PĂ©rez Carballo's essay is its attempt to articulate what is at issue between various views of what semantics is about. He calls this 'the hermeneutic question'; on a rough first gloss, it is the question of what it is for a theory in a particular discipline to be correct. He then argues that expressivism is compatible with a standard semantics that (for example) assigns sets of worlds as the semantic values of sentences because expressivism is a way of answering the hermeneutic question: according to the expressivist, a theory that assigns a set of worlds p as the semantic value of a sentence s is correct not because utterances of s represent (in some robust sense) the actual world as being among the p worlds but rather because p adequately characterises certain features of the mental state expressed by utterances of s -- an intriguing suggestion, which Carballo leaves relatively undeveloped.

Of those authors who explicitly defend a particular metasemantic question, Mark Greenberg (in the second of his two contributions) comes closest to one of the questions discussed in the editors' introduction. He argues that we should look for a constitutive account of content -- an account of its nature or essence' (169) -- and that we should not be satisfied with an account that merely specifies the grounds or metaphysical bases of content since an account of grounds leaves important questions unanswered. (In the editors' terminology, one might say that Greenberg's idea is that basic metasemantics is incomplete without a theory of meaning.) For example, consider Lewis's view that naturalness plays a role in determining content. Greenberg's claim is that this sort of view does not go deep enough. Even if Lewis is right, we should wonder: 'What is it to have content such that a property's naturalness is part of what makes it figure in the content of a representation?' (178)

II. Issues in 'Basic Metasemantics'

Greenberg's push for a constitutive account is motivated by arguments in his first essay, which emphasises the importance of Burge style examples that Greenberg takes to show that 'there are no beliefs or inferences, or transitions in thought more generally, that a thinker must have or be disposed to make in order to have a particular concept.' (147). Greenberg shows (what is perhaps obvious) that this claim poses a problem for conceptual role theories of content and also (what is somewhat more surprising) that it poses a problem for standard covariation theories (that attempt to account for content in terms of nomic or informational connections). Proponents of these theories who take the threat of the Burge phenomena seriously have sometimes claimed that while in normal cases, concept possession is to be explained in terms of (e.g.) conceptual role, there is a second, distinct way of possessing concepts (by 'deference'). But, Greenberg claims, this is no minor addition: if deference is a distinct way of possessing concepts, then conceptual role or covariation theories do not capture what it is to possess a concept (the nature or essence of concept possession) even if they explain one possible ground of concept possession.

Michael Caie's chapter argues against supervaluationist accounts of vagueness and suggests that the considerations that seem to motivate supervaluationism in fact motivate metaphysical indeterminacy. He situates supervaluationism in a Lewisian framework, according to which the right semantic theory is the theory that maximises fit with linguistic usage and intrinsic eligibility. Supervaluationism seems attractive on this framework because it is a way to accommodate the fact that many precise semantic theories fit use and eligibility equally well. But, Caie shows, there are alternatives to supervaluationism that fit the facts of use and eligibility as well as the supervaluationist theory. So the supervaluationist must endorse a double standard: she holds the precisifications on which her theory is based to a different standard than her own view. Caie then argues that the proponent of metaphysical indeterminacy can avoid such double standards by adopting a view on which it is determinate that our words have content but indeterminate what content they have.

Jeffrey C. King defends his 'coordination account' of the metasemantics of context-sensitive expressions, according to which the semantic values of contextual parameters are determined by facts about speaker intentions and facts about what a 'competent, attentive, reasonable hearer' (102) could come to know, against the objection (which he takes from unpublished work by Michael Glanzberg) that contemporary formal semantic theories often assign complex formal entities (such as functions) as the values of contextual parameters and that these formal entities are not plausibly the objects of speaker intentions. King argues that, at least in the case of gradable adjectives, there is a plausible alternative account according to which contextual parameters are simpler entities that can be determined by speaker intentions and that in cases where speakers do not seem to have suitably specific intentions, a range of semantic values are determined.

Amie L. Thomasson argues that deflationism about truth -- the view that the concept of truth is not 'even attempting to refer to a substantive property the nature of which we can investigate and hope to discover' (185) -- leads to a corresponding deflationism about existence -- the rejection of the view that '"existing" names (or even attempts to name) a property or activity of objects the substantive nature of which we can investigate' (192). Truth deflationism is a widely held view, and existence deflationism may strike many as counterintuitive, but Thomasson's argument is simple: in essence, it is just that we can derive existence claims from truth claims (for example, '<n is P> is true' entails that n exists and Ps exist). If there is no substantive characterisation of truth, then we may 'derive different existence claims from the truth of diverse propositions -- without any common condition holding, and so without any single substantive criterion for existence being fulfilled in all cases' (196). (Whether the argument is sound will depend on exactly how one understands truth deflationism. If truth claims entail existence claims and existence has a substantive nature, then there is a substantive necessary condition for truth. But in the absence of further argument, it is not clear that this entails that 'truth' names a substantive property or indeed anything about the nature of truth.) Thomasson goes on to argue that existence deflationism fits naturally with a conceptual role theory of concepts and that this leads to 'easy ontology': 'many of the most disputed existence questions may be answered quite straightforwardly' (205). (This is one of several places where it might have been interesting to put the volume's papers into dialogue with each other. One wonders how Thomasson might respond to Greenberg's discussion of conceptual role theory.)

Richard G. Heck Jr. is concerned to develop a view of semantics that can resist 'radical contextualist' arguments to the effect that truth-conditional semantics is impossible because truth conditions can depend on such a wide range of contextual factors that they could only be assigned by a theory that incorporated a complete theory of human rationality. Heck concedes that if we agree that 'semantic theory must systematically assign a truth condition to each actual utterance' (346), the objection is correct (a point he develops in detail with respect to demonstrative reference). But he rejects this conception of semantics in favour of a Strawsonian view on which speakers use sentences to say things. On Heck's view, there is no role for objective notions of reference or of what is said; there is only what speakers intend to refer to and to say and what their audiences interpret them as saying. Language facilitates this communication because the words one uses 'constrain what one can say by uttering them' (354); the job of semantics is to describe these constraints.

III. What Is Semantics?

A third group of papers can be seen as taking steps towards defining semantics. Glanzberg's conception of semantics is motivated by his view of the scope and limits of semantic explanation. He claims that the best explanations in semantics arise where semantic theory makes use of mathematical apparatus (as in the case of generalised quantifiers). Semantic theories tend to be unexplanatory where they rely on disquotation, but there is no alternative to this reliance, so semantic theory is inevitably explanatorily partial. On Glanzberg's view, we can make sense of this state of affairs by adopting a particular view of the structure of the lexicon: the lexicon consists partly of information that is 'coded by the language faculty' (282) and partly of 'pointers' to the conceptual system outside the language faculty. Semantic theory is explanatory in those areas where it can capture information coded by the language faculty; where the lexicon consists of pointers outside the language faculty, semantics may resort to disquotation.

Matti Eklund's essay is one of the hardest to place with respect to the metasemantic questions that are the focus of the volume. Eklund's focus is on views that regard the concept of truth as inconsistent and conclude on this basis that it ought to be replaced. (He himself agrees that truth is an inconsistent concept but is sceptical that it ought to be replaced.). So one connection between Eklund's essay and metasemantic issues is that he is considering an approach to semantics that is normative and revisionary: the aim is not to describe the semantics of the words or concepts we have but to engineer better words and concepts. A further connection is that his focus is on replacing truth for theoretical purposes, specifically for the purposes of semantic theorising. Eklund argues that this project makes sense only on some conceptions of the role of truth in semantics.

Isidora Stojanovic focuses on the semantics/pragmatics distinction. She observes a tension between the view that semantics is concerned with stable, lexically encoded properties of words and the view that semantics must determine truth conditional content (since truth conditions are what feed in to Gricean pragmatic processes). Stojanovic's solution is to complicate the semantics/pragmatics distinction: semantics is stable and lexically encoded; in order to get truth-conditional content, it must be supplemented by 'prepragmatics', which provides (inter alia) referents for context sensitive expressions.

Karen S. Lewis also focuses on the distinction between semantics and pragmatics. She argues that many phenomena that are claimed to motivate dynamic semantics can be better explained pragmatically. For example, Lewis argues that cross-sentential anaphora can be explained pragmatically on a view that allows pragmatic processes to work off more than a set of worlds (for example, a view on which semantic values are structured propositions) since such a view can distinguish a sentence like 'A woman walked in,' which permits anaphoric continuation ('She was wearing a hat'), from a sentence like 'It is not the case that no women walked in', which is truth-conditionally equivalent but does not permit anaphoric continuation. Roughly, the idea is that since a cooperative speaker will typically use an indefinite description such as 'a woman' only when she plans potentially to say more about the woman, hearers can reason in a broadly Gricean way to the conclusion that they should look out for further reference to the woman.

IV. Metaphysics of Semantic Values

Stojanovic's and Lewis's papers are in part concerned with the metaphysics of semantic values, and one further paper also has metaphysics as its focus. Samuel Cumming gives an account of the metaphysics of 'discourse content', beginning with the notion of discourse referents: entities that are posited to do explanatory work in the semantics of anaphora. The idea is that 'Two noun phrases denote the same dref [discourse referent] if, and only if, they are anaphorically linked' (214). On Cumming's view, discourse referents are not the same as referents (in the usual philosophical sense): drefs are socially constructed abstract objects. He argues that cross-discourse anaphora is possible, so 'the lifespan of a dref is not limited to the discourse in which it was established' (220). He claims that the apparatus of drefs puts one in a position to understand various Fregean puzzles about the meaning of empty and co-referring names as well as Geach-style puzzles about intentional identity.

V. Concluding Remarks

It should be clear from these summaries that this is a wide ranging and extremely interesting collection that reflects many current trends in philosophical theorising about language, notably attention to developments in formal semantics. (It also reflects trends in philosophy more generally, including relatively uncritical acceptance of hyperintensional notions (ground, essence, real definition, etc.) that would have been anathema to a previous generation of philosophers.) It clearly shows the continued relevance of semantic and metasemantic issues to metaphysics, metaethics, and other areas of philosophy, as well as the intrinsic interest of various metasemantic questions. I look forward to seeing the new wave of metasemantic theorising that is likely to follow.