Method and Metaphysics in Maimonides' Guide for the Perplexed

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Daniel Davies, Method and Metaphysics in Maimonides' Guide for the Perplexed, Oxford University Press, 2011, 215pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199768738.

Reviewed by John Inglis, University of Dayton


Leo Strauss has shaped philosophical discussions of Maimonides's Guide for the Perplexed with the view that Maimonides contradicts himself in order to prevent the uneducated from threatening the author for unorthodox positions. Maimonides serves as the first case study in Persecution and the Art of Writing (1952), Strauss's presentation of the history of significant esoteric texts that only the philosophical elite can understand (Strauss 1988, ch. 3). Philosophers and historians who work on Maimonides frequently take a stand in relation to Strauss's interpretation. We often work on single issues in order to claim that Maimonides does or does not contradict himself. The type of contradiction that gets the most attention is Maimonides's seventh sense, which, as he notes, he uses in order to protect the uneducated. For example, Maimonides states that: "The vulgar must however not be allowed under any circumstances to become aware of the contradiction of these premises, and the author will therefore at times adopt every possible means to camouflage it" (Maimonides 1995, p. 48). Much contemporary scholarship aims at identifying or deflating one or two examples of this sort of contradiction in the Guide. In his carefully argued book, Daniel Davies builds on recent scholarship to offer a more contextual perspective on the methodology of the work as a whole and a valuable nuanced interpretation of the seventh contradiction.

Davies's account is noteworthy for the clarity with which he presents his arguments and the attention he pays to the historical context. He draws upon the historical and philosophical work of recent decades to present Maimonides in the context of his entire project and in relation to the work of his contemporaries. Clarity and context support the case for an important difference between what Davies proposes as Maimonides's seventh sense of contradiction and one who contradicts himself in order to hide his or her views from a segment of the population. One way in which Davies does this is to move the focus beyond single issues. For example, in order to offer a fuller picture of the Guide, Davies devotes chapters to issues regarding the eternity of creation, necessity, negative theology, divine existence, divine knowledge, and a cosmologically important vision of Ezekiel. This widening of the discussion marks a significant difference from other approaches, but Davies has another card up his sleeve. Extending recent work on dialectic, he shifts the locus of contradiction to contemporary tensions between common opinions, many rooted in scripture, rather than contradictions grounded in shielding philosophical demonstration (pp. 11-13, 16-17; Kraemer 2000, Lorberbaum 2002). Davies argues that Maimonides challenges readers to consider completing claims that lie outside of demonstration, frequently based on the Torah. On this reading, Maimonides constructs a dialectical presentation across different topics in order to prepare active readers "to test" various opinions themselves. Since these issues often involve opinions rooted in the Torah, the task is to become skilled at untangling apparent contradictions and this requires extensive philosophical training and dexterity.

A longstanding difference lies between those who see Maimonides's Guide as a philosophical break from earlier exegetical works and those who do not. By locating the seventh type of contradiction in claims often based on scripture and not on philosophical demonstration, Davies avoids both poles of this dilemma.

With Herbert Davidson, Davies agrees that many of the standard philosophical examples of the seventh type of contradiction claimed for the Guide do not work (pp. 20-21; Davidson 2004). But in proposing that Maimonides is concerned to untangle contradictions in scriptural interpretation, Davies departs from Davidson. On Davies's interpretation, the Guide remains philosophically and religiously important, because physics and metaphysics can approximate the inner meaning of the Torah. On this reading, Maimonides counsels exegetes in the Guide of the Perplexed to go beyond the face value of scripture by using philosophy to understand that to which scripture alludes. For ordinary people who lack philosophical training, a more literal reading of the Law provides a guide for the practical life.

One important issue taken to involve contradiction is the question whether Maimonides sides with the Torah on the creation of the world in time, or with Plato's view of matter being eternal. In the not so distant past, historians presented Maimonides as a critic of Plato's view and as adhering to the scriptural account that the world began to exist in time. But Maimonides also praises Plato for arguing that only matter and not the world is eternal (Maimonides 1995, p. 115). Shifting the focus to Maimonides's praise for Plato works against his support for the view of the Torah that God created the world with a beginning in time. Should we read Maimonides as building contradictions into his text in order to mislead the orthodox, or is something else going on here? Maimonides also appears at one point to side with Aristotle over the Torah. For example, Davies considers Jonathan Malino's argument that a careful reading of Maimonides lends support to the view that he in fact agrees with Aristotle that the world itself is eternal (pp. 31-32).

While philosophers and historians have proposed the eternity of the world as an example of the seventh contradiction understood as hiding philosophical truth from the uneducated, Davies presents it as a clarification of inner scriptural truth in regard to an issue that lies beyond demonstration. His proposal is that Maimonides presents the different views so that philosophically educated readers can benefit from what each account has to offer. For example, being clear about the reasons why Plato avoids necessity in the activity of the highest being helps an educated believer to unpack the Torah's inner truth regarding the purposefulness of creation (pp. 39-40). Reading Plato prepares one to understand the truth that lies hidden in scripture. Davies does not argue that for Maimonides Plato got it right. Many scholars dispute which philosopher it is that Maimonides thought got it right, but this is not Davies's project. Neither does he argue that Maimonides sides with every opinion rooted in the Torah. Instead, Davies proposes that Maimonides trains philosophical exegetes to mine truth hidden in the Torah.

In the central chapters of the book, Davies widens his scope to consider positive and negative attribution in order to clarify that negative attribution does not contradict divine knowledge of particulars (pp. 54-55). In this review, I will limit my comments to Maimonides's view that human beings cannot accurately discuss divine attributes in positive terms in order to indicate Davies's method for reading the Guide. The Torah presents anthropomorphic images of God walking in the Garden of Eden, which might suggest that we can discuss qualities of the divine as we discuss flowers and trees. Maimonides argues that since our words arise from experience with individual things, they do not serve to describe the divine because God is unlike creation. It makes more sense to use negation when applying concepts to the divine. For example, existence is a concept that one acquires from encountering and working with individuals. We say that something exists based upon its qualities and the good to which it aims. Davies offers a careful account of Maimonides's account of the bounded nature of individual things and the good that results (pp. 73-77). A thing exists to the degree that it is good, and it does not exist to the degree to which it lacks the fullness of the good. Maimonides denies that God is limited in this way. Since creaturely existence implies limitation, Maimonides argues it is not accurate to apply existence to the divine in any positive sense. It is more accurate to deny of the divine the limitations of creaturely existence. Therefore, through negation we can reason out ways in which the divine does not exist under limitation. In this sense, God does not exist as creatures do, the sort of view that led Julius Guttmann to deny that Maimonides affirms divine perfections in any positive sense (p. 56). Davies counters this interpretation with the claim that while Maimonides is concerned in his Guide to sketch limitations on human knowledge, he does not deny positive attributes of the divine.

In reply to philosophers and historians who take up Guttmann's approach, Davies offers a reconstruction of Maimonides's positive account of divine existence. Since creaturely essence differs from creaturely existence, creatures can exist or not exist. On the other hand, for Maimonides the existence of the divine does not stand apart from the divine essence. The divine perfections and existence are one (pp. 75-76). The difficulty for human beings is to make sense of this unity since it stands at odds with the beings of ordinary experience where existence stands apart from essence and is bound up with limitation and imperfection. In Wittgenstein's language, one makes a grammatical mistake when confusing creaturely and divine existence.

Davies's challenge is to work up an account of Maimonides's view of the uncreated existence of the divine that does not involve negation (pp. 79-80). The difficulty is that Maimonides does not say much about this sort of existence. Davies uses a notion of unlimited existence to cash out the uncreated existence of the divine. Unlike the limited existence of individual creatures, the existence of the divine lies beyond limitation, including the qualitative boundaries of the perfections of individual things. The essence of a creaturely being stands in relation to both the bounded perfections of each individual that receive existence as well as the full range of creaturely perfections that stretch across the hierarchy of creation. Therefore, boundaries and the full scale of creaturely perfections provide the framework for limited creaturely existence. Uncreated existence lies outside this sphere of limitation. One issue with the discussion of uncreated existence is that the reliance on negation does not build a case for a positive attribute of the divine. From Maimonides's perspective of what human beings can know, Guttmann might have a point after all. Davies notes this difficulty when stating that since our words for Maimonides are so completely bound up with the limitations of the created order, we can speak only with "absolute equivocation" about the perfections of the divine (p. 82). But this view of human understanding does not threaten Davies's point that Maimonides affirms positive perfections in the divine including existence, even if he is unclear regarding what this amounts to. There need be no contradiction between a reliance on negative attribution in human understanding and affirming positive attributes of the divine. Davies's contribution is to construct arguments for how this works for Maimonides, arguments that Maimonides alludes to and often does not spell out.

In the final chapters Davies presents Maimonides's notion of the cosmos, including its dependence for existence on the will of God (chs. 7-8 and in particular p. 153). Davies explains that such dependency would perplex a close follower of Aristotle who holds for the necessity of the cosmos. Importantly for Maimonides, creaturely existence is rooted in the divine. This would be a useful point for Davies to pursue when suggesting that Maimonides might have worked up something like Aquinas's view of analogy in order to account for creaturely and divine existence (pp. 82-83). He notes that Aquinas's view rests on a notion of creaturely perfections existing in a prior manner in the divine. In the future, Davies might compare Maimonides's understanding of the dependency of creaturely existence on the divine with Aquinas's view of the prior nature of creaturely perfections in order to reconstruct further Maimonides's picture of divine attribution.

In his conclusion, Davies presents the Guide not as a work of philosophical contradictions calculated to hide truth from the uneducated, but as a work for religious and intellectual training. He argues that there is no gulf between religion and philosophy for Maimonides as they are "mutually complementary" to one another (p. 157). Davies successfully completes what he sets out to do, which is to build on recent philosophical and historical research and introduce a new and significant approach to reading Maimonides's Guide. The book serves as a fine contribution to the literature for scholars who work on the area as well as an introduction to important issues that should serve graduate students and faculty well. Maimonides studies have been an exciting area in recent decades and Davies's important work opens new doors for reconstructing the Guide for the Perplexed.


Davidson, H. 2004. Moses Maimonides: The Man and His Works. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kraemer, J. 2000. "Maimonides' Use of (Aristotelian) Dialectic." In Maimonides and the Sciences<span normal"="">, ed. R. S. Cohen and H. Levine, 111-130. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic.

Lorberbaum, R.P. 2002. "On Contradictions, Rationality, Dialectics, and Esotericism in Maimonides's Guide of the Perplexed." Review of Metaphysics 55:711-750.

Maimonides, M. 1995. The Guide of the Perplexed. Trans. Chaim Rabin. Indianapolis: Hackett.

Strauss, L. 1988. Persecution and the Art of Writing. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.