Methodology and Moral Philosophy

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Jussi Suikkanen and Antti Kauppinen (eds.), Methodology and Moral Philosophy, Routledge, 2019, 241pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138322097.

Reviewed by David Faraci, Durham University


This book is fairly typical for edited volumes in contemporary analytic philosophy. The editors chose a topic. Most of the authors wrote essays that are clearly relevant to that topic, but also illuminate its breadth, together composing something not quite cohesive. Most of the essays are good (there is no obvious correlation between relevance and quality) and perhaps more importantly some are refreshing as the authors have allowed themselves room for the kind of innovative exploration that the cutthroat world of journal publishing tends to discourage.

Given this, if someone tells me they are interested in methodology and moral philosophy, I probably won't recommend that they run out and buy this book. But this somewhat negative point is not what I want to focus on; I mention it only because this is after all meant to be a review of the book. I'd rather focus on two things. First, that if someone tells me they are interested in any of a number of questions in ethics or metaethics, I will definitely point them towards particular chapters. Second, that I am glad books like this continue to be published, because whether or not they work well as books, they winnow a lot of wheat that our field's publishing practices too frequently mistake for chaff.

The volume is split into four parts -- to their credit, Jussi Suikkanen and Antti Kauppinen, the editors, do not try to shoehorn the chapters into a single narrative. The first part, "The Prospects of Empirical Ethics," is quite different from the others. As the title suggests, its three chapters concern the role that empirical data can or should play in ethics. In Chapter 2, "How to Debunk Moral Beliefs," Victor Kumar and Joshua May argue that global epistemological debunking arguments in ethics fail, but that non-global ones represent an important space in ethics for empirical work. They introduce a dilemma for global debunking arguments: debunkers either (a) identify an epistemically defective contributor to moral belief-formation, but fail to demonstrate that it is a major contributor (the "empirical flaw"); or (b) identify a major contributor to moral belief-formation, but fail to demonstrate that it is epistemically defective (the "normative flaw"). I find their suggestion that there is tension between these two elements of debunking arguments interesting, but their motivation of the "normative flaw" horn focuses on issues that are simply too large, contentious and difficult for the space afforded them. One cannot reasonably expect to resolve the ongoing debate over the potential gap between the moral truth and our evolved moral attitudes in a single paragraph.

In Chapter 3, "Who's Afraid of Trolleys?" Antti Kauppinen (the other wrote the introduction) defends traditional thought-experiment-based ethical methodology against recent empirical challenges. In my view, he offers a much-needed critique: experiments tend to be run in contexts markedly different from those in which these methodologies are actually employed. As he puts it, "it would be a mistake to think that philosophical training fosters a skill in thought experimentation that can be exercised in isolation from the context of a philosophical debate" (69). Hear, hear.

In Chapter 4, "Learnability and Moral Nativism: Exploring Wilde Rules," Tyler Millhouse, Alisabeth Ayars and Shaun Nichols offer empirical evidence that people are capable of learning "Wilde rules" (named for Oscar Wilde's bon mot that a "gentleman never offends unintentionally"), which prohibit allowing something but permit deliberate causation of it  This serves to undermine the nativist hypothesis that certain uncommon norm structures are unlearnable -- analogous to the idea that the unlearnability of certain grammatical structures supports linguistic nativism. The chapter showcases empirical methodology more than discussing it, so it's a bit of a stretch as far as relevance is concerned, but again I saw no correlation between relevance and quality; it's fascinating work.

The volume's second part, "New Methods," comprises two chapters. Chapter 5 is Catherine Wilson's "Metaethics from a First-Person Standpoint," in which she "describe[s] an approach to the question of the sources of normativity that developed from my own frustrations in teaching metaethics from a third-person standpoint, that is, in the normal way, to undergraduates and graduates" (94). Her narrative may well be pedagogically useful -- the content is drawn from her open-source textbook -- but as someone who works in metaethics, I did not find it especially illuminating.

Chapter 6, Andrew Sepielli's "Consequentialism and the Evaluation of Action qua Action," is one of the chapters that makes me particularly glad this sort of volume exists. And I say that despite disagreeing with him strongly. Sepielli offers a defense of consequentialism on structural, axiological grounds. This doesn't represent a new method per se; lots of consequentialists have tried to show that alternatives face structural problems -- consider the "paradox of deontology." But close enough. The basic idea is that authoritative norms are all things considered norms, and that being all things considered means evaluating things full stop, rather than with respect to some limited category. Consequentialism, Sepielli claims, considers whether an action is good; other views ask only whether it is a good action.

This is clever and fascinating. But I don't think it works. Sepielli thinks that pure evaluation of an action evaluates it as "a kind of thing or event" where "what makes a thing good are the past, present and future consequences of its existing, occurring or obtaining" (115). In short, the suggestion seems to be that the kind of evaluation we apply to states of affairs is a sort of default. I see why this would be attractive to many people in a long line of consequentialist-heavy normative ethics. I also see it as precisely the sort of claim non-consequentialists have been at great pains to reveal as a substantive commitment, rather than an implication of axiological structures defensible on ethical-theory-neutral grounds. (I raise similar concerns about the "paradox of deontology" in my (2019).) But this doesn't mean the work isn't important; for one thing, it helps me (and hopefully others) to better understand where sophistical consequentialists and I disagree.

The last two parts of the volume are "Evaluations of Recent Methods" and "Metaethics and Normative Ethics." I want to discuss three of the remaining five chapters together, so from here I step a bit out of order.

Part 3 opens with Chapter 7, Christopher Cowie's "The Similarity Hypothesis in Metaethics." It is (as is typical for Cowie) a carefully thorough critique of a common, but often underspecified claim: that theoretical and practical normativity are sufficiently similar that we should expect their metasemantics, metaphysics and epistemology to parallel one another. If you're interested in that claim -- and a lot of people are -- I'd give it a read.

Part 4 opens with Chapter 10, Pekka Väyrynen's "Normative Commitments in Metanormative Theory." Väyrynen offers a recipe for demonstrating that a metaethical view has normative ethical implications. He then applies this recipe to argue that some particular metaethical views unexpectedly have such implications—metaphysical views about the modal status of normative principles; and metasemantic views about what fixes the extension of normative predicates. I suspect he’s right, though I am less sanguine than he is that having such implications doesn’t threaten the credibility of the views in question. For reasons of space I won’t say more about why, except to note that my concerns are related to issues of “non-arbitrariness” discussed below. Whatever the significance of Väyrynen’s results, it’s very cool stuff.

The remaining contributions are Part 3, Chapters 8 and 9 -- James Lenman's "The That" and Jack Woods' "Footing the Cost (of Normative Subjectivism)" -- and Part 4, Chapter 11 -- Matthew Silverstein's "Revisionist Metaethics." Each speaks in favor of metaethical anti-realism (broadly construed), but in very different ways: Lenman argues for a socially and historically cognizant Humeanism about reasons; Woods argues that subjectivism is compatible with the kind of "universality" required by normativity's functional role; Silverstein suggests that there is tension between the intensional and extensional adequacy of metaethical theories, and argues that we should give priority to the former -- something he takes to favor anti-realism.

As an anti-Humean, anti-subjectivist realist, I was unconvinced by any of the three chapters. But there was a marked contrast between my reactions to Lenman's versus the other two. Lenman's seemed to me an exemplar of an all-too-common, frustrating pattern: a philosopher notes some important features of a phenomenon and suggests that those features support their favored view, without engaging at all with the many philosophers with opposing views who explicitly recognize those very same features. For example, consider the point -- made by many in many different ways -- that deliberation in accordance with some sort of normative standard seems inescapable. One incarnation that's received a good deal of recent attention is Bart Streumer's work defending a literally unbelievable error theory (e.g., his 2017). Given this, I found Lenman's claim that such inescapability is "intended to embarrass the error theorist, as indeed it should" as ironic as I did needlessly acerbic (149).

Woods and Silverstein, by contrast -- much like Sepielli -- left me with a bolstered understanding and appreciation of my opponents and our disagreements. And I'll note once again that I found these chapters illuminating in ways that remind me of the particular value of this sort of volume.

Woods thinks that common claims that normativity's function requires a kind of non-arbitrariness should be understood "as claiming that the functional role of normative theorising requires that we be able to criticise and correct the actions of others" (175). Setting aside whether he is right that subjectivism can accommodate interpersonal criticism and correction, I think we should be at least as concerned with intrapersonal (and intrasocietal) non-arbitrariness. I am just as interested in criticizing and correcting myself and us writ large as I am in criticizing and correcting others in accordance with norms I endorse. I have difficulty seeing how Woods' sense of universality could accommodate that.

This brings me finally to Silverstein. Ideally, a metaethical view would vindicate or explain away our intuitions about the nature of ethics -- e.g., the non-arbitrariness constraint just discussed -- as well as about the content of ethics -- e.g., that killing innocents for fun is wrong. Silverstein argues that given the inchoate nature of secular ethical inquiry, where there is tension between such intensional and extensional theoretical adequacy, we should privilege the former.

I'm sympathetic. But I was surprised that Silverstein places ethics' purported universality in the extensional camp. Universality obviously has extensional implications, but I view it as an implication of the intuitions about non-arbitrariness just discussed. I'll close with a few words about this, following on the heels of Silverstein's claim that intuitions about universality have their roots in religious ethics:

our shared sense of moral principles as governing everyone regardless of their attitudes evolved from a religious context in which divine commands take precisely that form. In the Abrahamic religions, at least, God's laws are generally universal in scope: 'Thou shalt not kill' is supposed to govern everyone, not merely those whose desires would be subserved by refraining from killing. (221-2)

I am no religious scholar, but this at least doesn't strike me as obviously correct. The particular command mentioned notwithstanding, the majority of Jewish laws -- Judaism, of course, being the OG of Abrahamic religions -- are not universalistic. They are explicitly the Abrahamic god's laws for the Jewish people. Indeed, at least early forms of Judaism were meant to be consistent with other peoples' having different laws from their own gods.

What religious ethics does have is a different kind of universality of enforcement. It seems likely that the loss of divine enforcement explains early secular ethical obsession with the "why be moral" challenge. But that challenge is independent of the kind of universality of application Silverstein is talking about -- relativists can wonder why they should be moral at least as easily as anyone else.

Rather than being a feature of religious ethics that has persisted past its time, I see the demand for universality of application as rooted in concerns that span the divide between the religious and the secular. One of our oldest bits of metaethics is the worry that divine commands might be too arbitrary to explain morality's authoritativeness -- not the authority of external enforcement (obviously the divine can provide that) but the authority of internal allegiance; not "what keeps me from defying God?", but "why should I take God's command as what's to be done?" What our distance from religious ethics has done, I think, is sharpen our focus. I suspect this partly explains flagging interest in the "why be moral" challenge. I think it also helps explain increased attention to "substantive" or "authoritative" normativity, rather than morality.

It seems to me that in secular metaethics, this same concern generates resistance to views that ground ethics in features of individuals or social structures. Perhaps there can be non-arbitrariness and authoritativeness without universality of application. But I, for one, find it difficult to see how, at the fundamental level, something could non-arbitrarily command my allegiance, but not yours. And this, of course, is just my worry about Woods again.


Faraci, David. 2019. 'Wage Exploitation and the Nonworseness Claim: Allowing the Wrong, To Do More Good'. Business Ethics Quarterly 29 (2): 169-88.

Streumer, Bart. 2017. Unbelievable Errors: An Error Theory about All Normative Judgements. Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press.