Mexican Philosophy in the 20th Century: Essential Readings

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Carlos Alberto Sánchez and Robert Eli Sanchez, Jr. (eds.), Mexican Philosophy in the 20th Century: Essential Readings, Oxford, 2017, 270pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190601300.

Reviewed by Manuel Vargas, University of California, San Diego


This is a landmark volume, one that makes available a cluster of interrelated and historically important texts that have mostly been unavailable in English. It is an anthology of philosophical work published in Mexico between 1910 and 1960. There are nineteen chapters, an introduction that provides some context and motivation for the volume, and biographical information about each of the authors. The book enables the teaching of courses that focus on issues in 20th century Mexican philosophy, and it constitutes a considerable expansion of English-language translations of work in Latin American philosophy more generally. It is a tremendous resource for researchers, as well as those looking to diversify syllabi.

Prior to this volume, the situation for specialists in Mexican philosophy working in the U.S. was roughly akin to trying to teach the history of ethics without access to any works by British utilitarians: agreeable enough to some, but hardly an ideal situation for the field as a whole. Carlos Alberto Sánchez and Robert Eli Sanchez's anthology goes a long way towards solving the problem of inadequate access to central texts in this tradition. The volume includes all the canonical figures, many of their important forerunners, as well as the work of a number of adjacent interlocutors.

Some historical context helps to spell out why these figures and issues have a particular significance. At least since European colonization, philosophy in Latin America has been significantly influenced by philosophical work produced elsewhere, especially in Europe (and more recently) in the United States. A recurring concern voiced by Latin American philosophers about their own work has been that it is too derivative and insufficiently original or authentic. There are a handful of philosophical movements within Latin America that are arguably immune to this criticism. One of these is the "the philosophy of Mexicanness," which is also the centerpiece of this anthology.

On Sánchez and Sanchez's reading, the particular mid-20th century episode known as la filosofía de lo mexicano, or the philosophy of Mexicanness, was not just a Mexicanized version of existentialism. Rather, it was the culmination of a multi-generational project to pursue philosophy from and about Mexican circumstances. The shared commitments of this tradition were roughly as follows: human agency is significantly structured by culture; that culture is shaped by history and can only be understood in light of that history; that the possibilities for meaningful, ethical life are both enabled and disabled by features of one's cultural and historical situation; and that freedom, community, and authentic living require an awareness of one's culture and history.

The anthology includes readings from a number of distinct philosophical orientations and topics in 20th century Mexico. These include: Mexican positivism and anti-positivist reactions; metaphilosophical debates about historicism and its alternatives; accounts of the nature and significance of community; the philosophy of culture, and especially, Mexico's uneasy narrative about the unification of indigenous and European peoples; and perhaps most centrally, Mexican existentialism and its rejection. Social philosophy, philosophy of culture, and debates about historicism loom large throughout, and there is enough content and thematic variation to the volume that one can build syllabi around the material in substantially distinct ways.

One set of readings concerns the relationship of the moral and the aesthetic to a scientific worldview. The essays by José Vasconcelos (Ch. 1) and Antonio Caso (Ch. 3) are partly responses to the legacy of Mexican positivism, which drew heavily from Auguste Comte and Herbert Spencer. They are also efforts to articulate a picture of human beings that does not reduce them to biological functions or mechanistic descriptions. Some of these issues also emerge in the Caso/Lombardo debate, where Caso's Catholic-inflected view finds friction with Lombardo's commitment to historical materialism (Ch. 7).

Readings by Vasconcelos (Ch. 1), Justo Sierra (Ch. 2), Samuel Ramos (Ch. 5), and the debate between Caso and Lombardo (Ch. 7), are concerned with the proper aims of higher education, including the role of nation-serving and nationalist-inspiring ambitions in education, and the degree to which universities ought to be in the service of particular ideals apart from the search for truth.

Metaphilosophical concerns -- disputes about how to understand philosophy, and to what philosophy in Mexico ought to aspire -- are central concerns of essays by Ramos (Ch. 6), José Gaos (Ch. 9), Leopoldo Zea (Ch. 10), and the Francisco Larroyo and Gaos debate (Ch. 8).

Edmundo O'Gorman's intriguing essay on "Art or Monstrosity" (Ch. 15) considers various challenges for reflecting on art produced in indigenous Mexico. It is something of a stand-alone essay, but it would pair well with other readings on aesthetics, with a unit on indigenous philosophy, or with essays reflecting on the challenges of getting outside of one's own intellectual or cultural traditions.

Perhaps the core readings concern the philosophy of culture and the significance of one's relationship to community. Chapters focused on these issues include the Caso/Lombardo debate (Ch.7), the readings by Luis Villoro (Ch. 11-12); essays by Emilio Uranga (Ch. 13), Jorge Portilla (Ch. 14), Rosario Castellanos (Ch. 16), José Revueltas (Ch. 17), and Alfonso Reyes (Ch. 18) -- although this last is more kaleidoscopic and impressionistic than a stolid bit of traditional philosophy. In these readings, narratives of identity and consideration of one's national and historical circumstances take center stage.

For those who want to cut to the chase, the texts by Zea, Villoro, Uranga, and Portilla constitute the canonical core of a self-conscious attempt at delivering a philosophy of Mexicanness. The essays by Uranga and Portilla are particular highlights of the volume. Uranga argues that the nature of Mexican being -- a product of a particular cultural history -- is exceptionally proximal to the basic condition of human beings more generally -- namely, uncertainty about normative matters. This creates a distinctive pathology in Mexican cultural life, he thinks. Portilla's account focuses on the experience of community or transcendence, and what happens when institutions that ought to produce those experiences fail to do so. When the sense of community is weak or fragile, people retreat to smaller communities structured by interpersonal ties. The appeal of the authoritarian political figure, Portilla thinks, is grounded in the sense of a personal tie to a figure who can provide a normative ground for one's life. These are fascinating texts that reward repeated readings.

Finally, the texts by Revueltas and Abelardo Villegas (Ch. 19) are important critical reactions to the project of a philosophy of Mexicanness. Revueltas offers a compelling account of the mechanisms of national identity-formation, and voices skepticism about the essentialism he takes to be implicit in the idea of Mexicanness. Villegas (Ch. 19) echoes the concern about essentialism, and also expresses doubts about the role of historicism within the tenets of filosofía de lo mexicano.

For scholars working on these topics, the arrival of this anthology is indisputably a matter of celebration. The accessibility of this core set of texts will surely help the field grow. There are, nevertheless, three ways a second edition could improve on the present one. First, it would be useful to include the original publication information of all the texts, as it is missing for texts in the public domain. Second, it would be helpful to those new to this material to have a better sense of the logic behind the order of readings. As things stand, texts are ordered by publication date, except when they aren't. The departures go unexplained.

A third and more difficult issue is that among the nineteen chapters, only one is by a female author (Castellanos's "On Feminine Culture"). This limited representation of women philosophers is consistent with many Spanish-language anthologies focused on philosophy in Mexico, which tend to offer little or no representation of work by women. This is not an uncontested matter in the literature. As Fanny del Rio has shown, the absence of women philosophers in Spanish language anthologies on Mexican philosophy is not to be explained by there having been no women philosophers, or no women philosophers trained in elite institutions by prominent academics.[1] There were; and there is some reason to think that the dearth of women authors in standard Spanish-language anthologies reflects, in part, a wider and more systemic devaluation of the philosophical production of philosophy by women in Mexico.

Sánchez and Sanchez recognize the worry. They write that they selected "authors and texts that clearly frame a tradition and simultaneously provide a point of entry for those who are willing to engage with it critically, especially those who will offer feminist, indigenous, or contemporary critiques" (xxiv). Traditions aren't static, though, and if authors are being wrongly excluded from the dominant narratives of a tradition, it is unclear what the virtue is in reproducing that exclusion, even if only to provide a target for legitimate complaint. This seems especially pressing in a work that will -- as this one surely will -- become a standard text for teaching. Moreover, even within the constraint of trying to capture a tradition of philosophical work on Mexican circumstances from 1910-1960, there is still the question of how we, here and now, best understand what was going on during that period.

Other omissions are straightforwardly explicable. Within the scope of philosophy focused on Mexican culture, there are canonical but otherwise readily available texts that were either too long to include in the volume (e.g., Samuel Ramos' Profile of Man and Culture in Mexico) or texts that are otherwise readily available (Vasconcelos' preface to The Cosmic Race; Portilla's Phenomenology of Relajo; and, several other works by Zea and Villoro). Moreover, those interested in developments after the collapse of Mexican existentialism -- including the rise of analytic philosophy in Mexico, and efforts at the recovery of indigenous thought -- will need to look elsewhere. Each of these is a reasonable omission, and to its credit, the volume does not pretend to be a comprehensive guide to all of the history of philosophy in Mexico. It is, however, a largely successful guide to arguably the most distinctive part of 20th century philosophy in Mexico.

This volume is the most important English-language contribution to the study of Mexican philosophy in the past fifty years. It will be of interest to historians of Mexican thought, those looking to expand their curricular resources in philosophy, those working on questions of social and cultural identity, scholars seeking to understand the wider history of existentialist philosophy, and anyone working on Latin American philosophy. It will undoubtedly spur teaching and research on Mexican philosophy in the United States and beyond. The editors, translators, and series editors at Oxford University Press should be applauded for introducing a new audience to a fascinating chapter in the history of philosophy.

[1] See del Rio, Fanny (2018) "Notes for an Ethical Critique of the Histories of Philosophy in Mexico: Searching for the Place of Women," Essays in Philosophy: Vol. 19: Iss. 1, Article 3.