Michael Fried and Philosophy

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Mathew Abbott (ed.), Michael Fried and Philosophy, Routledge, 2018, 267 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138679801.

Reviewed by Daniel Herwitz, University of Michigan


This is a superb set of essays on the writing of Michael Fried. If the book gives rise to worries at the core of its formation -- something I will discuss at the end of this review -- these do not detract from its excellence. Every essay is lucid, scholarly, meticulously crafted, detailed and acute in a way worthy of Fried's virtuoso and philosophically subtle approach to the history of art. His pathbreaking work over half a century raises questions about the very nature of the medium of art and its tenebrous, shifting character, about the relation between "theater" and absorption in painting and more recently, photography, about the question of what authorizes a moral voice in art criticism, especially about modernism and minimalism, and about the dovetailing of art history with philosophy.

Fried's work began as a critique of minimalism in praise of color field abstraction. In his texts for the catalogue Three American Painters (1965) and his "Art and Objecthood" (1967), he burst upon the scene of American art with moral command and razor-sharp formalist eye, arguing that the point of the abstract art he was concerned with, was to defeat the condition of theatricality.  This condition referred to a situation in which the work ceased to contain an underlying gesture through which the use of the medium was meant, be it the unfurling of paint on unprimed canvas or the immersion of self into the picture in the manner of an original settler/discoverer of America, charting his way through the wilderness of paint towards the great beyond. Theatricality meant the blankness of an object refusing this state of inner animation, this sense of the medium being deploying in an original way. The mere thingness of minimalist works, especially those of Tony Smith, was Fried's animus, the thing (as it were) to be overcome conceptually, morally, artistically. For Smith's works, on Fried's reading (and his is one of many, since the muteness of Smith's objects may give rise to an endless range of interpretation), eschew the purpose of art, which is to displace itself from the world of things in virtue of the power of meaning made through the use of a medium in some trancelike fusion of both. (Arthur Danto calls this meaning being "embodied" in the work). Smith's work is theatrical in Fried's sense because it directly confronts the spectator in the way a turnpike or road sign does. Smith's works were, in Fried's philosophical understanding, exercises in belligerent blank particularity, mere replacements for the turnpikes, road stop joints, signage and the endlessly recessive empty horizons that the photographer Robert Frank pictured when he went to photograph America and found instead people in states of getting, spending and aggression and psychological homelessness even in their own towns.

Frank went to photograph America and didn't find it, which was the point, and may be, pace Fried, the point of Tony Smith's work and other objects that have, in Fried's terms, relinquished the struggle for meaning, saying: "This is how it is. There ain't much. I hope you find this little-or-nothing sublime in its own strange presentness [Fried's wonderful term for Smith's work]. It is what America is like." So perhaps, rather than disavowing the use of the medium, the power of Smith's work arises precisely through this disavowal. If one wants to call this "theatricality" maybe it is a more mixed blessing than Fried thought. Or perhaps Smith's objects no more confront the spectator than an empty stretch of road does? To me their theatricality is unclear. You can't be blank, and theatrical at the same time. Not easily anyway.

As Mathew Abbott writes in what I think is the best introduction to Fried's work I have read, "It should . . . be clear that 'theatrical' is for Fried an irreducibly evaluative term: to call a work 'theatrical' is to disparage it, not simply to say that it appeals to the beholder, but that it does not manage successfully the problem of beholding." (p. 3) Abbott points out that the second phase of Fried's work was to turn to the French painting of the second half of the eighteenth century, demonstrating through close scrutiny of the paintings of the period and close reading of the art critics of the time (Diderot), that it too was consumed by a drama around absorption and theatricality. In response to a form of painting increasingly theatricalized to the point of empty pageantry (as if a mirror of the Court of Versailles), painting moved in the dialectically opposite direction, creating work in which the figures were absorbed in what they were doing, in complete indifference and oblivion to the spectator. This displacement of the viewer from what is going on in the picture was, Fried argued, a way to preserve the seriousness of art against the onslaught of theatre.

Since theatricalization is, Fried said, a permanent liability of art, each attempt to defeat it became all the more furious to the point where artists felt it was no longer possible to continue in this vein and a sea change happened, significantly altering both sides of the dialectic (absorption and theatricality), sublating both into a third thing in what Hegel would call reconciliation. This happened with Eduard Manet and is at the core of Fried's 1996 Manet's Modernism: or the Face of Painting in the 1860s.

Fried's reading of Manet's Olympia of 1863 is brilliant in terms of working through this drama around the presence of the spectator. But Manet's critique is not merely formal. It is about the place of the beholder in a culture of museums, prostitutes and the spume of enjoyment. Manet, who invented the modernist stance of critique-in-paint, is keen to lambaste the commodifying pressure on art central to this market, along with omnipotent and voyeuristic bourgeois gaze on women, commodities and art that the Parisian brings to it. And so he refuses the easy and immediate visual access to pleasure the bourgeois viewer expects in a picture, as in a mistress. His is a Hitchcock game played with his audience.

As the introduction notes, this drama is not seamlessly carried into the ensuing century around abstraction and minimalism, there is a gap (as one would expect given the intervening two world wars, the trauma of sixty million dead, the invention of cubism, etc.). This suggests that the drama is one with the liability to arise in specific kinds of circumstances, and then to arise again in similar kinds of circumstances, the question being what these are, and how similar they are. The answer, I am pretty sure, goes way beyond formalist issues to questions of society, culture and politics.

And so, following the gap, Fried rediscovers a similar kind of drama around absorption and theatricality in contemporary photography and painting. But with a difference. The work he discusses gives every appearance of being inert and theatrical like Tony Smith's. But it is rescued from this by its dialogue with intention and the nature of the image and medium. The relevant work is by Jeff Wall, Thomas Demand, Andreas Gursky, along with the paintings of Joseph Mariano.

Robert Pippin and Rex Butler both write incisively about Fried on photography. In particular, Butler points out, Fried recognizes that "the visible difference between art and objecthood has shrunk to virtually nothing and it may be impossible ultimately to defeat theatre." (p. 145) Stephen Mulhall enforces the point by writing about the way Fried's various key moments in the history of art, (of Caravaggio, of Manet, modernism and contemporary photography) can been seen to be recursively linked into a kind of genre, along the lines of what Stanley Cavell proposes in his introduction to Pursuits of Happiness (1981) about the way the films he assembles speak to one another, each illuminating the others.

All of which points to a return to Tony Smith through the lens of what followed. Perhaps recursively the way photos defeat mere objecthood can be read back into Tony Smith? And if not, why not?

I suspect what is being left out of the discussion of Tony Smith, which Fried's later work on Jeff Wall might cause him to reconsider, is Smith's similar dialogue with meaning in an America he knows is already flattened by the culture of financial capital and aggressive militarism. The unfinished New Jersey Turnpike which so affected Smith was an image of global sovereignty and its road to American utopia declared as early as the concept of Manifest Destiny, and as permanently unfinished as that road was when Smith saw it. America is a blank road to nowhere. I once visited a museum of constructivist art in the tropics of Venezuela full of revolutionary objects, objects meant to impel the country towards its modernist destiny. They failed. The buildings remained unfinished, like Ozymandias' empire in the sand. (Nothing beside remains.) Perhaps this is what Smith was all about in declaring the brute fact of the object?

As Paul Gudel says in his contribution, the literalist effect depends on seeing human acts as sublime." (p. 131) So why not see them that way? What is to prevent it?

Throughout this book are excellent discussions of what a medium is, of theatricality in relation to skepticism, of what it means to see art with the eyes of the past no one can anymore quite occupy, that is with Diderot's eyes, and a number of other themes of profit connecting art history to philosophy.

Abbott speaks of Fried's notion of the essence of a medium not as a timeless core but endlessly pliable. (p. 25) The question of how the key concept of a medium is elaborated and/or relied on by Fried is also and beautifully discussed in Stephen Melville's contribution which ends with the thought that:

What Hegel and Fried can seem to offer us are lessons in what it means to speak historically -- what it means to have an object that can only be discovered, invented, or acknowledged within and through the complex conditions of form (shape and matter, tense and aspect, earliness and lateness, the rupture and grace of achievement). (p. 113)

Walter Benn Michaels explores Fried on the color field artist Morris Louis, whose paintings unfurled paint poured directly onto primed canvas. These gestures were clearly ones that both relinquished and claimed the control of an actor, since Louis was the person shepherding the paint. But it also flowed in ways he was unable to control with anything like the precision of pen and ink, that is, drawing. Issues for the theory of action in relation to painting are thus raised, both for Fried and Benn Michaels, who points out that part of Louis' anxiety was that his work would thereby appear wholly unintended: the mere doodling of a child or the result of some kind of accident involving a paint can. And yet the role for accident, or what John Cage called chance operations, is crucial to the very metaphysics and expression of these works, which at once solicit an artist and reject that call, as if following Kant's dictum that art, when seen as beautiful is always also seen under the aspect of nature. Here the nature is that of Newtonian physics unfurling itself independent of the human hand. The questions raised for the theory of action are most interesting, as some actions require control but also partial relinquishment of control, while others don't or don't to the same degree. An example of the former is the raising of children, who are steered into being by their parents but also take on their own lives independently. It is between the poles of control and liberty that Louis works with his child-paintings.

About photography, Stephen Mulhall 's acute essay, argues that:

For Fried the moment these photographs disclosed the possibility . . . of making photographs primarily and essentially intended to be framed and hung on a wall -- in other words to be looked at like paintings rather than merely to be examined up close by single viewers -- they were bound to confront a new question, or rather a question long familiar to painters newly transposed into a photographic context, concerning the relation between the photograph and its beholders. This led them to engage with a range of concerns familiar from the context of modernist painting -- absorption, corporeal merger, facing-ness, the relation between beholder, artist and subject. (p. 94)

I find these remarks highly etiolated. Institutionalizing a new art form (photography) as yet another thing to be looked at on walls carries over the conventions and practice of whatever constitutes looking at things on walls. But is everything from the extant practice carried over, as it were automatically? More must be said about why merely placing photos in the position of spectators leads photographers to engage the drama of the spectator in anything like the same way paintings do. Why not a very different way? In the manner say, of how film inherently displaces the spectator in virtue of the spectator's inability to enter the world on screen (Cavell, The World Viewed). Again, I think the explanation will go far beyond mere aesthetic issues.

I regret there is no space to discuss the fine essay on Schopenhauer by David Wellbery, the fascinating remarks about formalism as a kind of utopia by Richard Moran, the surprising essay by Knox Peden linking Fried with Jacques Ranciere, the also wonderful essays by Magdalena Ostas and Andrea Kern placing the concept of absorption within the frame of the emerging aesthetics in eighteenth-century France, the also superb essay on Fried's poetry by Jennifer Ashton, not to mention Fried's own fascinating excursion into the darkly brilliant world of Soren Kierkegaard.

Apart from the fine essay by Diarmuid Costello, the collection understands Fried through articulate praise rather than criticism. Which is a pity, because I think one never understands ideas of importance without also knowing what is wrong with them. I would have preferred inclusion of more than one person who takes a markedly different approach to visual art and its history, a writer like T.J. Clark, who could generate real debate with Fried rather than sophisticated agreement, if sometimes qualified. What happened to the importance of dissent in philosophy, which is after all a form of respect? Moreover, this book proceeds entirely within aesthetic issues framed autonomously from the wider world, following Fried's own perspective on art history. It does not at any point step outside the close ups to seek a midrange or establishing shot placing art in the wider ambit of history, culture and politics. The authority of Fried's intellectual style therefore goes unchallenged.

So, let me end with a couple of challenges.

First, it is not simply that the key events in history of art are described as if they took place in an encomium where formal creativity demanded new solutions, along the lines of the way Thomas Kuhn describes the history of science in terms of the inner logic of paradigms playing themselves out from within until they fracture and a new one needs to be found. Richard Moran seems to think about painting in this way: "As with mathematics or morality itself, we can see the work of art as defined by its own internal necessities, by its self-given laws. And the various failures or corruptions of the internal autonomy of the work of art, when it submits to laws or interests outside its own realm" (p. 127) But life outside of aesthetics is not a corruption, it is generative of the aesthetic which cannot be understood apart from it. This was the very calling card of the philosopher John Dewey in Art as Experience.

For Fried, as for Kuhn, a paradigm cracks open when its internal dynamics come to the breaking point. But in fact, much of the history of science actively participated in the construction of ideology devoting itself, for example, to the construction of race, to its medicalization, etc. Paradigms (if there are such) work outside themselves, articulating what Michel Foucault called power. As does painting.

We may also ask with Michel Foucault: what generates the breaking points for the paradigm? Is it simply that formal work has gone as far as it can go? Or are the key players formed by a social world, a changing economy, wars and treaties and exclusions or inclusions in art markets? And by the museum, that instrument of eighteenth century nationalism whose purpose was to drain the works collected of their original meanings (usually social) and transmute them into inert objects of contemplation that could also be called, thanks to the power of their theft: national patrimony?

Aesthetic autonomy has always been an illusion. It was an idea and practice formulated by the eighteenth century thanks to its individualistic concepts of freedom (articulated first, in 1683, by John Locke), its institutions of the museum and concert hall, and the growth of consumer culture thanks to empire. One does not want to be stupid; autonomy is a critical marker of human freedom including aesthetic freedom. This the eighteenth century discovered and pronounced. But autonomy is as utopian as formalism is (Richard Moran), and for exactly the same reasons. The question is always to balance terms of autonomy with those of interconnectedness within the field of culture, and by "interconnectedness" I mean to the institutions of art, to art markets, to modernity, to historical trauma, to American deadpan and arrogance and spirituality, and so on.

Finally, there is something to be asked about the very moments in the history of art so brilliantly described and understood by Fried, namely, why at such moments an opposition of terms, that is aesthetic strategies, arises that is incapable of reconciliation? One that can only be reconciled later, in the French case with Manet. And why at that point reconciliation suddenly becomes possible? Surely this has to do with the growth of an artworld as a system of market economy that took place between the late eighteenth century and the mid- nineteenth (see T.J. Clark's wonderful The Painting of Modern Life: Paris in the Art of Manet and His Followers, 1985).

Michael Fried has done nothing less than introduce a new set of categories into the understanding of art. The question becomes how to work with them. Most art sits on a continuum between the poles of absorption and theatricality, which is where innovation and message resides. Examples are the theatre of Brecht, the films of Max Ophuls, the painting of the German neo-realists of the twenties and later, the performances of Josef Beuys. These artists all veer between the poles of theatricality and absorption. Which leads to my final question: Under what circumstances do theatricality and absorption or any binary terms formulate themselves in an art historical (or other) world when so much art exists betwixt and between? Are there any general things to say about this or is it a completely contextual matter? Either way the answer will, I'm pretty sure, be political, and economic, and social, not simply aesthetic.