Michel Foucault: Key Concepts

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Dianna Taylor (ed.), Michel Foucault: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2011, 200pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652358.

Reviewed by Cynthia D. Coe, Central Washington University


Michel Foucault: Key Concepts is an anthology by contemporary Foucault scholars explaining and applying, as the title suggests, Foucault's most important ideas. The volume is divided into three parts -- power, freedom, and subjectivity -- with four essays addressing each topic. Taken as a whole, the essays provide succinct and insightful explanations of Foucault's contributions to our understanding of those concepts as well as demonstrations of how they can be put to use, both within Foucault's own work and in original applications. Particular attention is paid to the concepts associated with works from Foucault's "middle" and "late" periods: discipline, assujettisement, biopower, power/knowledge, parrhēsia, and the care of the self. Although the introduction begins by highlighting the unsystematic nature of Foucault's work, the essays together reveal the strong connections between the forms of analysis Foucault pursued and the concepts he developed to address those questions.

In addition to presenting a fascinating exposition of Foucault's work, the essays constitute a sustained defense of the political importance of his thought, in response to critiques from Nancy Fraser, Charles Taylor, Nancy Hartsock, and Jürgen Habermas (among others). These critiques have often culminated in the claim that Foucault's positions on power, agency, and freedom undermine the possibility of political activity in the service of any normative vision whatsoever; to the extent that Foucault attempts to avoid moral nihilism in critiquing disciplinary power or offering alternative models based in the care of the self, for instance, he is engaging in "crypto-normativity" (Habermas' term in The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity, 1992).

As Dianna Taylor claims in the introduction, Foucault challenges us to understand power, freedom, and subjectivity differently, and in relation to each other, in order to reflect critically on our own present -- a project the essays in the book admirably advance. In a Nietzschean vein, he refuses the polarity of nihilism and normative foundationalism. If we are searching for normative foundations, what Foucault is up to will look like nihilism. But the purpose of his genealogical work is to illuminate the contingency of our intellectual quests in order to open up new practices of resistance to particularly modern forms of oppression. In that sense this anthology continues recent work by English-speaking Foucault scholars, including Ladelle McWhorter, Amy Allen, and Judith Butler, to address the contradiction of the genealogical subject -- as both the product and author of a genealogy. The task is more precisely not to resolve the contradiction but to draw out the powerful and productive consequences of this ambivalence in our lives.

The essays bear out this commitment to responding to the charge of nihilism by demonstrating how the genealogical method functions as critique and resistance to what Nietzsche called "fixed ideas" -- a critique and resistance that exposes both the contingency and the power of such ideas. The concreteness of these analyses is consistently strong throughout the essays, but I will mention as examples three that are particularly original. Marcelo Hoffman provides a reading of Frederick Winslow Taylor's Principles of Scientific Management (1911), a text intended to make industrial production more efficient, that illustrates the elements of disciplinary power -- an individualizing, observing, and ranking gaze that cultivates the usefulness and docility of laboring bodies. As Hoffman notes, Taylor's text reflects anxieties about the ways in which workers will attempt to resist this goal and also about the reluctance of managers to adopt his proposals -- "suggesting that only an ensemble of deeply contested practices sustain the exercise of disciplinary power that strives to appear natural and spontaneous in the very bodies of individuals" (39).

Ellen K. Feder's analysis of gender-identity disorder and Cressida J. Heyes' discussion of the framing of the "obesity epidemic" demonstrate the contemporary resonance of disciplinary attempts at normalization. The social and medical efforts to maintain a system in which we believe that naturally there are only men and women, with no one who is both or neither, should be understood as disciplinary techniques of surveillance -- including a great deal of vigilance about deviant behavior, preemptive training, and correction. Feder's example deftly indicates the decentralized nature of power in Foucault's account: the pressure to be a normal boy or a normal girl, which essentially means to flee from any trace of ambiguity about one's gender identity, comes from "everywhere and nowhere" (62). It also emphasizes the ways in which power is productive rather than repressive. We create boys and girls, women and men, and the beliefs and behaviors that naturalize such creation. The individual created by these processes of assujettisement is both a docile (normalized) and an autonomous (self-normalizing) subject.

Heyes uses this model to understand the forces that position obesity as a public health epidemic and the measures that are suggested to counter this problem -- including self-surveillance, confessions taking the form of "my weight loss journey" (171), and the perceived empowerment of a new control over one's body. These genealogical forms of critique thus make us confront the disjunction between our ideals and our practices and impel us to resist such normalizing forces. All of these applications of Foucault's thought enact the form of freedom Foucault more often implies than describes, an account of freedom that refuses the naturalistic and the teleological narratives of autonomy we have inherited from modern philosophy.

As Dianna Taylor's concluding essay emphasizes, for Foucault the political project of critique must recognize how it is located within the historically conditioned present -- how we have become who we are -- and must also recognize how it is limited by that tradition. Foucauldian critique does not support the transcendence of these constraints, in the sense of finding or creating an authentic and autonomous self. If power is productive of subjectivity, then our subjectivity is inextricably constituted by relations of power, and the activity of critique will be an ongoing process, specific to our historical situation, of refusing the necessity of naturalized constraints and seeking out alternatives ways of thinking and acting.

In this sense, Foucault is not only an experimenter himself but invites all of us to such experiments as well. Even as they chart the insidious ways in which disciplinary techniques continue to function in our lives, the essays in this anthology draw on the optimistic and open-ended dimension of the idea that subjectivity is a practice in which we are perpetually constituted and reconstituted, maintained, and destabilized, rather than existing as a static entity. That is Foucault's version of "the undefined work of freedom," as he says in the late essay "What is Enlightenment?" This work of critique traces the delicate tension within the process of assujettisement, by which we are both subjects and subjected to forces outside our control.

Although most essays cover familiar aspects of Foucault's work, Karen Vintges' essay on spirituality ventures to examine Foucault's references not only to early Christianity and Roman religious practices, but to Zen Buddhism and the Iranian Revolution. Brad Elliott Stone and Eduardo Mendieta analyze Foucault's interpretation of the idea of parrhēsia, truthful speech, that among the ancients was both a practice of freedom and a way of caring for the self. Even as they reveal the resources of these concepts in rethinking freedom, Stone and Mendieta indicate the obstacles to the attempt to reconstruct in any direct way those "ethopoetic" practices in our own historical context (118). Many of the essays helpfully situate Foucault's work in relation to major figures in the history of philosophy and movements within twentieth-century thought, including Socrates, Augustine, Descartes, Hobbes, Kant, Nietzsche, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty.

Inevitably, there is some redundancy among essays, given the interrelated nature of Foucault's analyses. As introductions to Foucault, the essays are better read as free-standing examinations of elements of Foucault's thought, rather than a systematic text that should be read straight through. This is in keeping with the claim that the emancipatory potential of Foucault's thought lies in collaborative work -- overlapping, intersecting, and unceasing. There are tensions between some of the essays as well: Edward McGushin's characterization of the art of the self emphasizes the connections to Sartrean authenticity, while Heyes reads Foucault as rejecting the idea of uncovering a true self, claiming instead that any such liberatory narrative is itself contained within a disciplinary frame. These tensions largely reflect ambiguities within Foucault's work itself, but they also reflect the attempt to translate Foucault's unfamiliar description of subjectivity into a conceptual framework that demands a clear separation between the chosen and the coerced, the autonomous and the heteronomous.

Most of the essays are written in an extremely accessible way, so that readers who are entirely unfamiliar with Foucault's work can trace its central themes, but there are a few essays that employ a more complex conceptual background and seem to expect a more expert reader. Appended to the essays is a chronology of Foucault's life and a superb bibliography of Foucault's books, articles, interviews, and lecture courses, as well as recent secondary scholarship in English. In general, the text will be invaluable to undergraduates, graduate students, and others who are interested in overcoming the truncated and reductive versions of Foucault that all too often substitute for a careful consideration of his work -- not only readers in philosophy, but also all of the other disciplines Foucault has influenced: anthropology, archaeology, history, and literary theory.