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Frederick Rosen, Mill, Oxford University Press, 2013, 315pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199271061.

Reviewed by Henry R. West, Macalester College


This is a valuable study of Mill's social and political thought. Frederick Rosen brings a lifetime of study of utilitarian thought, especially of Jeremy Bentham, so he can put Mill's thought into a historical context. He also brings a fresh interpretation to Mill's writings. Rosen believes that too much attention is paid to Mill's more widely read publications -- On Liberty, Utilitarianism, and Considerations on Representative Government. He believes that these must be seen in the context of what he regards as Mill's earlier and more original writings -- the Logic and the Principles of Political Economy. This book is an attempt to do just that. Rosen traces the development of Mill's social and political philosophy from the Logic, through Mill's correspondence with Auguste Comte, to the Principles. Throughout he attempts to show that the positions taken in On Liberty and Considerations on Representative Government can be found in the earlier works. He also analyzes a "method of reform," based on the earlier works, employed in later writings.

The middle section is on Mill's relations with Auguste Comte and is an important contribution. It is an analysis of Mill's correspondence with Comte and of Mill's book, Auguste Comte and Positivism. Rosen claims that most scholars study the book and then look to the correspondence to interpret it. He reverses the process, first analyzing the correspondence and then approaching the book as Mill's defense against possible misinterpretations of the correspondence. In the correspondence, Mill was seeking to learn from Comte and to find points of agreement. He hoped that Positivism would be a philosophy to combat the intuitionism that he regarded as an obstacle to progress and improvement. By the time Mill came to write the book, he saw Comte's position as an obstacle to progress and an enemy of liberty. At the same time that Comte's notion of a "Religion of Humanity" had much to recommend it, in the hands of Comte such a religion would be as oppressive as Calvinism. The middle section is especially valuable for understanding the development of Mill's social philosophy. Mill went through a stage of admiring Comte's sociology, but he came to see its limitations. It excluded psychology and political economy as independent sciences. Nevertheless, Rosen argues, Comte was a major influence on Mill: Mill's recognition of the limitations of Comte as a thinker is an important way of understanding Mill's views on psychology, liberty, and related topics.

Rosen's first section provides insights from the Logic for understanding Mill's social and political philosophy. He focuses on the Logic's last part, referring the reader to other writers (e.g., Jackson 1941; Kubitz 1932; Ryan 1987; Scarre 1989; and Skorkupski 1989) for a full account of Mill's philosophical writings (p. 7). Looking for Mill's method of doing social analysis, Rosen notes Mill's distinction between an "Art" and a "Science." An art provides the end of practical philosophy, and sciences are to provide the means to that end.

Unlike many commentators, Rosen does not believe that Mill begins with Art, even the Art of Life, which is identified as happiness. He believes that the sciences of psychology and its subdivision "ethology" (the science of the development of character) determine the Art for which they are directed. Although the Art of Life states that happiness is the end for which such sciences are directed, Rosen thinks that Mill has only an indefinite concept of happiness. Different individuals, with different characters, especially those with an "active" character, have different conceptions of what a flourishing life will be and, therefore, different conceptions of happiness. Thus, according to Rosen's interpretation, although Mill is an "Epicurean," he did not start from hedonism and inductively and deductively seek the means to achieve pleasures or happiness. He instead started from the limitations of individual and national character and sought to determine what possibilities were open to individuals with those limitations, including the degree of freedom to change them. Mill believed in "progress" and "improvement," but they were relative to time and place. Rosen calls attention to Considerations for an example of Mill's method, which is not that of starting from the goal of happiness:

With an end defined in utilitarian terms as one of increasing happiness, issues concerned with the institutions best suited to realize this end would be discussed with an eye to replacing those which produced unhappiness or failed to produce sufficient happiness with those which advanced the greatest happiness of the members of a given society. But Mill did not proceed in this fashion. (p. 65)

Mill instead constructed two contrary theories and sought reform by reconciling them. One was that government is a practical art of adjusting means to ends: "Institutions were chosen to realize these ends and the people were stirred to demand the creation of the institutions . . . as a series of mechanisms for producing good government" (pp 65-66). A second theory "saw the development of institutions as a spontaneous development and not a matter of choice. One simply learned about them and adapted oneself to work with them" (p.66). These reflected liberal and conservative positions. Rosen says that Mill challenged the Conservative position more than the Liberal, but sought to show that without general support from both reform was not possible.

Another example discussed by Rosen is in The Subjection of Women. Again, according to Rosen, Mill found contraries that needed to be reconciled:

[Mill] could easily have argued in a straightforward manner that human happiness or utility generally required that women should be freed from various legal and societal restraints and constraints, as part of the gradual and steady improvement of humanity. But such an argument, however compelling, would not address the complexities of the relationship between men and women in his day and in the future. In place of a straightforward argument, supposedly based on utility, Mill's starting point was the identification of a series of contrary views that enabled him to identify directly what in the informal logic of ordinary men and women would enable them to advance towards freedom in society and in the family. (pp. 232-233)

The title of the series this book is in, Founders of Modern Political and Social Thought, would lead us to think that Rosen would look to Utilitarianism as an important source of the foundations of Mill's thought. But in fact Rosen pays it little attention. There are only eight or ten references to Utilitarianism and only seven pages (201-203, 249-252) of detailed attention to it. Furthermore, he regards it as an exceptional case where Mill is playing a role as a "public moralist," a description that he thinks does not elsewhere apply to Mill. This is curious. I assume that Rosen is thinking of morality in the narrow sense of individual moral obligations. Mill certainly thinks of justice and liberty as moral issues. Mill spoke of Utilitarianism as based on an unpublished essay on the "foundations of morality," but he incorporated his earlier unpublished essay on Justice as Chapter V of Utilitarianism, and there he analyzes justice as a sub-field of morality in which there are individuals with rights.

Rosen also downplays Mill's analysis of justice in Utilitarianism and elsewhere. Rosen says that those philosophers who find a "theory of justice" in Mill's writing (e.g., David Lyons, Jonathan Riley, Fred Berger) fail to see the importance of psychology and ethology. An assessment based on them would deal with

how the claims to absolute or relative equality, for example, might be adopted by members of a particular society, at a particular time, given their character, the state of their education, and their psychological dispositions. . . . The role of the "theory" is thus fairly minimal (pp. 209-210).

This degree of relativism also explains why Mill is at most a "qualified" socialist.

Rosen has an excellent discussion of Mill's analysis of the difference between "communism" and "socialism," based on more or less radical conceptions of private property and equality of rewards for labor, and of the advantages and disadvantages of capitalism and cooperation. Rosen discusses not only Mill's views in the Principles, but also his Chapters on Socialism, which Mill did not complete and which was published after his death. In my opinion, not enough attention has been given to these writings to explain Mill's social and political position. Rosen's discussion is most welcome. Based on Mill's relativism, Rosen points out that Mill can debate the pros and cons of private property and degrees of equality and liberty under various systems, but he cannot take a definite stand as to which is the ideal of the future. That depends too much on education, national character, and other factors.

Rosen's final chapter is devoted to The Subjection of Women. He uses the chapter to sum up the arguments he developed earlier and to see how Mill could apply his ideas to an important theme, the despotism exercised by men over women. And Rosen again calls attention to the importance of character:

If the end of legal enslavement through the reform of the institutions of marriage and related property arrangements might be the first step towards liberation, it was only the first step, as women should be free to break out from the restraints imposed on their character to end despotism in the family and in social life. (p. 23)

In general, Rosen is sympathetic to Mill's method of reform and to Mill's emphasis on individual and national character in his analysis of, e.g., justice, equality, liberty. Rosen does see that Mill is too optimistic in thinking that the "last vestige of despotism was out of step with modernity and must necessarily disappear" (p. 256).

Given the facts of two world wars, two economic depressions, and mass murder and economic chaos on an unprecedented scale, Mill's assumptions concerning modernity and progress might seem fanciful, if not false. . . . Nevertheless, Mill's approach continues to have some relevance today. (p. 257)

At the heart of Mill's idea of an advancing civilization was the principle of civil, or social liberty. Rosen quotes Mill (Subjection) regarding modern ideas and institutions:

It is, that human beings are no longer born to their place in life, and chained down by an inexorable bond to the place they are born to, but are free to employ their faculties, and such favourable chances as offer, to achieve the lot which may appear to them to be most desirable. (p. 257, quoted from Collected Works xxi, 272-3).