Mill's On Liberty: A Critical Guide

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C. L. Ten (ed.), Mill's On Liberty: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 243pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521873567.

Reviewed by Daniel M. Hausman, University of Wisconsin-Madison


Mill's On Liberty: A Critical Guide is a collection of ten essays concerned with aspects of On Liberty plus an introduction by the editor and a substantial bibliography. The introduction summarizes Mill's views in On Liberty and the main points in the essays in this collection. It does not explain why these essays were selected or how they add up to a critical guide. Unlike many classic philosophical texts, On Liberty is highly accessible, and it is not clear whether someone who wants a thorough understanding of Mill's essay would not be better advised to reread the original text than to consult a critical guide.

In any case, despite its subtitle, this volume is not really a critical guide. Few of the essays are critical and only a minority provide a guide to aspects of Mill's argument. Very little is said about the central problem of interpreting what Mill means when he maintains that only harm to others justifies limiting freedom.

Nevertheless, four of the essays might be considered as guides: the first three ("Mill's Case for Liberty" by Henry R. West, "Mill's Liberal Principles and Freedom of Expression" by David O. Brink, and "Racism, Blasphemy and Free Speech" by Jonathan Riley) plus the last essay ("John Stuart Mill, Ronald Dworkin and Paternalism" by Robert Young). West's summary of the main line of Mill's argument, the first essay in the volume, is not critical, but it is certainly a guide. It has the virtue of taking seriously Mill's claim that his defense of liberty is grounded in his utilitarianism. Although Brink in the second essay follows Mill's argument against censorship fairly closely, he is critical of the details and usefully develops the interrelations between the argument against censorship and the general arguments Mill makes in defense of the view that only harms to others justify limiting liberty. In the third essay, Riley covers some of the same ground as Brink, but arrives at the striking (and to my mind implausible) conclusion that Mill's views imply that "A speaker who joins a neo-Nazi organization or brandishes Nazi paraphernalia is duly punished for demonstrating against Jews and can reasonably be jailed and fined if he marches, parades, shouts out antisemitic slurs, and so forth anywhere in public" (77). The ground for this censorship -- which might be mitigated for practical reasons (78) -- is that such public acts constitute credible threats of violence against which people must be protected.

In the last essay in the volume, Robert Young lists the main arguments Mill gives against paternalist legislation and points out that there is no way to justify blanket negative conclusions concerning the success of paternalistic legislation. He then focuses on an argument of Mill (which is further developed by Ronald Dworkin) to the effect that actions can contribute to an individual's well-being only if they are endorsed by the individual. So coercing individuals for their own benefit is futile. The coercion undoes the benefit. Whether or not Mill ever makes this argument (which I doubt), it is not one that he or Dworkin should have made. For example, the fact that a particular swimmer refuses to endorse the requirement of staying on the shore during a shark alert does not imply that the state's closing of the beach did not benefit the swimmer (224). Although Young is right to maintain that the case for an absolute ban on paternalist actions does not go through, he pays little attention to the possibility countenanced by Mill's indirect utilitarianism that such a ban could be the best policy even as it rules out some actions that maximize happiness.

The fourth and fifth essays in the volume, "State Neutrality and Controversial Values in On Liberty" by Gerald F. Gaus and "Rawls's Critique of On Liberty" by Robert Amdur, are both concerned with the question of whether Mill's views are consistent with liberal neutrality toward reasonable comprehensive views of the good. Gaus begins with Charles Larmore's complaint that although the policies Mill endorses are largely neutral among competing conceptions of the good, Mill's justification for those policies is not neutral. Instead, it depends on a specific theory of what makes for a good life, which highlights the role of individuality. Gaus argues that this criticism overlooks the variety of arguments that Mill provides in defense of his principle of liberty and in particular the case Mill makes for the value of liberty for those who do not value individuality. Gaus' defense of Mill's neutrality is complemented by Amdur's critical evaluation of the contrasts Rawls draws between the neutral grounds for the priority of his first principle of justice (requiring maximal equal liberty) and Mill's non-neutral quasi-utilitarian argument for his principle of liberty.

The next three essays, "Mill on Consensual Domination" by Frank Lovett, "Autonomy, Tradition, and the Enforcement of Morality" by Wendy Donner, and "Mill and Multiculturalism" by Jeremy Waldron, are all concerned with the knotty problems posed for Mill by apparently consensual relationships that diminish the liberty of some of those who participate in them. The extreme case is voluntary slavery, which Mill judges to be impermissible on the grounds that permitting it in the name of freedom undermines rather than protects freedom. Lovett argues that if one takes freedom to be merely the absence of constraints, then relations involving domination such as traditional marriage or even slavery do not inevitably limit freedom more than avoiding such relations. Mill would, Lovett maintains, have been better advised to adopt a view of freedom as the absence of domination.

Donner and Waldron are also concerned about consensual domination, particularly as it arises within anti-liberal subcultures within liberal societies. Donner points out the tensions between Mill's critique of the contemporary institution of marriage, especially in On the Subjection of Women, and his insistence that Mormon polygamist marriages should be tolerated. Donner complains that "He scourges his own society for inducing conformity, yet the conformist patterns of Mormon marriages, he thinks, should be protected from persecution by liberal outsiders" (141). Donner plausibly maintains that the nurturing of individuality and the protection of liberty require not only restraint on the part of the state and of majority public opinion but also protection from tyrannical subcultures and the provision of an educational regime that equips young adults to reflect on the cultures within which they have been raised. Donner argues that without such protections, Mill's view that women voluntarily choose to enter polygamous relations is naive and unjustified. In emphasizing the risks of excessive state control of education, Donner argues, Mill underestimates the risks of indoctrination by other social bodies.

Jeremy Waldron further develops these concerns. After sketching a superficial Millian case for multiculturalism, he reminds the reader that Mill is concerned with individual liberty, not with the liberty of groups, and that even vulnerable and oppressed subcultures can threaten individual liberty. As he puts it, "If there is any support in his [Mill's] work for cultural diversity, it is an aspect of individual liberty, and he would be uncomfortable about any application of his theory which permitted oppression in the name of a tolerated culture, sect, or creed" (179). The only difference between oppression by the state or majority opinion (which is the only kind that Mill directly addresses) and the abuses of multiculturalism "is that the criteria of being 'irreligious or immoral' (or culturally inauthentic) are given now by an array of disparate cultural groups and by an overarching ethos intended to deflect or dissuade us from any genuine engagement between them" (174).

The only other essay in the volume, Justine Burley's "Mill, Liberty and (Genetic) 'Experiments in Living'", is something of an outlier. It consists of speculation concerning what Mill's views would have on cloning. But Burley has more to say about cloning than about On Liberty.

Readers interested in Mill's arguments against censorship may find that the essays by Brink and Riley are worth their attention. Those concerned with whether the argument of On Liberty violates liberal neutrality may find the essays by Gaus and Amdur useful. Readers focused on the implications of Mill's liberalism for multiculturalism and the limitations on freedom posed by minority cultural groups will find a great deal in the essays by Lovett, Donner, and Waldron. Nonetheless, in my view, the best way to understand On Liberty is to read it again and, as Mill would have wished, to challenge his arguments every step of the way.