Millikan and Her Critics

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Dan Ryder, Justine Kingsbury, and Kenneth Williford (eds.), Millikan and Her Critics, Wiley-Blackwell, 2013, 297pp., ISBN 9780470656853.

Reviewed by Craig DeLancey, State University of New York at Oswego


This fine volume is exactly as advertised: it is an opportunity for thirteen philosophers to offer criticisms (or -- more often -- friendly amendments) to the now substantial body of work of Ruth Garrett Millikan. It is not an introduction to Millikan's work, but neither does it require special expertise. It provides a representative sampling of much (but not all) of the current critical reaction to Millikan, illustrating where the alternatives and opposition to her theories lie. It could also serve well as an overview of her work for philosophers familiar with a few of Millikan's papers, or it could be a valuable introduction to someone willing to invest some time simultaneously reading some of Millikan's major works.

The volume has a brief preface by Daniel Dennett that is mostly personal but, with the kind of parsimonious clarity we have come to expect of Dennett, offers an attempt to summarize Millikan's "key insight": "that our ability to identify and reidentify things and properties in the world . . . starts with an innate perceptual proclivity to . . . identify distal things, a competence that we exercise without knowing . . . how or why it works" (xii). This is not an implausible summary, since it captures Millikan's biological approach, her radical externalism, and her move away from the idea that human actions should be explained solely or even primarily with human reason.

The editors' introduction offers an excellent summary of Millikan's work to date, while also integrating brief summaries of the essays by the volume's critics. It is divided into sections on proper functions, representations, concepts, and externalism. This division allows for an introduction to Millikan's primary themes while also serving as a way to organize the critical responses. This part of the book is accessible to a reader unfamiliar with Millikan's work, and could therefore stand alone as a valuable primer. It should also be noted that the editors have managed to be very clear. The precision of Millikan's thought is sometimes belied by the difficulty of some of her arguments. In this introduction, it is the precision alone that shows through.

Following the introduction is a complete bibliography of Millikan's publications. It ranges from her dissertation to a list of eight forthcoming papers. This is surprisingly engaging, since even a brief skim through the titles strikes the reader with the consistency of Millikan's research focus. It is well placed here at the beginning,because after reading the editors' introduction it reveals that they not only well captured her primary concerns, but they did not exaggerate (as one would expect any such summary naturally to do) the coherence of those concerns.

The rest of the volume is dedicated to the critical essays and Millikan's responses. The philosophers all take their task to heart: most of the thirteen essays are vigorously critical of some aspect of Millikan's work. Most of these criticisms (nine of the thirteen essays) are aimed at issues of teleosemantics, content, and concepts. This is perhaps representative, since it probably closely matches the proportion of Millikan's actual work that is dedicated to these themes.

Karen Neander argues that Millikan should allow a role for natural information. Peter Godfrey-Smith frames Millikan's semantics in a "sender-receiver" framework, and then -- partly inspired by research by Brian Skyrms -- suggests some alternative ways to conceptualize such a framework. Nicholas Shea criticizes Millikan's reliance upon the concept of isomorphisms in her theory of content. Louise Antony offers a defense of the language of thought, and David Braddon-Mitchell tries to recruit Millikan to two-dimensional semantics. Richard Fumerton attacks Millikan's claim that substance concepts are prior to all other concepts. Michael Rescorla offers honeybee navigation as a way to illustrate and evaluate Millikan's work on representations, and criticizes Millikan's notion of jointly motivational and informational states (what Millikan famously calls "pushmi-pullyu" representations). Jesse Prinz counsels Millikan to revise her content externalism ("outerism") to allow for more of a role for psychological mechanisms (and thus a bit of "innerism"). Cynthia Macdonald and Graham Macdonald encourage Millikan to reconsider a role for "the space of reasons," illustrated here with John McDowell's notion of de re sense.

One essay in the volume addresses issues in the philosophy of biology: Mohan Matthen argues that a more radical understanding of biological kinds should underlie Millikan's ontological presuppositions. Two of the essays evaluate Millikan's defense of realism. Crawford Elder argues that Millikan's realism about objects works for explaining natural kinds but not for explaining the endurance of an object over time. Charles Nussbaum argues that we can use Millikan's biological naturalism to justify the principle of noncontradiction. The last essay in the volume offers a historical perspective on Millikan and one of her contemporaries, Robert Brandom. In this essay, Willem deVries argues that Millikan and Brandom represent (and perhaps exaggerate the distinctiveness of) two strands in Wilfrid Sellars' thought.

Each of these critical essays is followed by a (usually brief) reply from Millikan. Millikan is generous but gives almost no ground. Seeing the interplay between Millikan and her critics, one is most struck by two things. First, it is remarkable how unified, but also how consistent her body of work is. Some philosophers are constantly revising and changing their views, but other philosophers seem to be people who are fixated on a set of problems, address that set with some special insight, and never stray from this direction. Millikan is of this latter kind. She has definitely clarified her views and changed some of the details, but the central aims of her first work and her most recent work are nearly identical. From the bibliography we learn that Millikan's first publication was titled, "An Evolutionist Approach to Language." That could stand as a title for her entire corpus. And, of course, the same could be said for the title of her first book, Language, Thought, and other Biological Categories, or of her most recent book, Language: A Biological Model. It is perhaps unsurprising then that many of Millikan's responses to her critics fall back on a citation of some previous publication, as she points out the place where she addressed the issue in question, or anyway came close to answering it.

When I studied philosophy in graduate school, my peers and I went to classes where we were made to read Kripke and Davidson and Quine and Putnam. Then, duty done, we met together at a coffee shop and discussed the latest paper from Millikan, pens in hand, arguing passionately. I cannot even recall how we found her work and knew we had to study it, but somehow there was consensus among us that she was producing the most exciting philosophy happening right then. Sometimes we were convinced that Millikan got a problem wrong (on one memorable occasion there was a mutual shout that Millikan was "nuts" to claim a beaver tail slap is an articulated representation); more often we felt she had offered a solution to some problem that other philosophers had mostly just obscured. But that was not what made us study her work so eagerly. The important thing was that Millikan gave us tools. Her theory of proper functions was something we could actually use. It had wide and general utility. Even those of us who disagreed with her theory of proper functions found ourselves struggling to develop an alternative that could be as valuable. We looked for variations, because we believed she was, at worst, mostly right. And, as we contrasted her work with what our instructors considered the contemporary canon, we felt certain that Millikan represented the vanguard.

I mention all this because the second striking feature of Millikan's responses to these thirteen criticisms is that she still seems the radical maverick. If it is fair to consider her critics in this volume as representative of current philosophy, then one gets the impression that most of us are still catching up with Millikan. In these essays she is asked to adopt the language of thought or a revised Fregeanism, to moderate her externalism and make room for the space of reasons, to reconsider information semantics. That is, most of the responses here ask Millikan to back up, to adopt some version of a more traditional view. And she is nowhere inclined to do so. To see her respond to this pressure, however, is very helpful to understanding the details and applications -- and, ultimately, the novelty -- of her approach.

The one thing that it would have been nice to see in this volume is some critical examination of Millikan's view of proper functions, and perhaps discussion of the alternatives to it. In the philosophy of biology, and in any theory where the notion of biological purpose has a role to play, we are confronted with the problem of how we might account for such purposes in the causal discourse of the sciences. Millikan's account of proper functions remains the most important and influential theory of how we might do this. But it has come under a great deal of critical scrutiny, and some scholars have tried to emend Millikan's theory of proper functions, or to offer an alternative. Unfortunately, this important critical response to Millikan's work is not considered here. Perhaps, however, this is to ask too much. Millikan's work is extensive, complex, and often very subtle (no doubt, sometimes too subtle). We cannot expect any one volume to respond to every important implication and assumption of her theories.

Millikan will be one of our most enduring contemporary philosophers. This book offers an invaluable perspective on critical alternatives to her theories, and in the process not only clarifies her place in many contemporary debates, but also clarifies some of the more challenging aspects of her work.