Mill’s Progressive Principles

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David O. Brink, Mill’s Progressive Principles, Oxford University Press, 2013, 307pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199672141.

Reviewed by John Skorupski, University of St Andrews


This is a very substantial study of Mill’s moral and political philosophy: the most important comprehensive study since Fred Berger’s landmark book of 1984, Happiness, Justice and Freedom. Since then there have been excellent individual studies of Mill’s Utilitarianism and his essay on Liberty; the scholarship on these two works is now enormous. And there is much on various other ethical and political writings. David Brink has been able to benefit from this scholarship; his new book provides a treatment of Mill’s ethical and political thought that is up to date both as history and as philosophy. It proposes a deeply thought-out, unifying new reading of Mill’s thought, which will attract lasting attention -- and, I expect, prove lastingly controversial. It should be read not just by anyone with an interest in Mill but more generally by anyone with an interest in the historical development of Anglophone ethical and political theory, or in the possibilities and varieties of perfectionism.

Brink covers Mill’s treatment of all the issues that were important to him throughout his life -- liberty, freedom of expression, sexual equality, democracy -- relating them to Mill’s fundamental ethical outlook. About all of these Brink has interesting things to say. However it is his interpretation of Mill’s fundamental outlook that is striking and new. As he says,

the most distinctive contribution of this study is to make the case for a perfectionist reading of Mill’s conception of happiness and explore the significance of this kind of perfectionism for other aspects of his moral and political philosophy. (p. xii)

He does not claim that the case for this reading is conclusive. Mill, he thinks, “appears to endorse three distinct conceptions of the good and happiness” (p. 63) -- hedonism, desire satisfaction, and perfectionism. “Perhaps no reading,” he continues,

can avoid attributing some inconsistency to Mill, but it would be nice to find a plausible reading of the texts that minimized his inconsistency. Perhaps there is more than one way to try to reconcile these three elements. But I will concentrate on the perfectionist reconciliation, because I take its systematic and interpretative credentials to be strongest. (p. 64)

I think we can set aside the ‘desire satisfaction’ reading of what Mill understood by happiness. As Brink notes (e.g., pp. 56-7, 65), Mill’s appeals to desire and preference are epistemic, not constitutive. He argues, famously, that “the sole evidence” that anything is desirable is that “people do actually desire it” (U IV 3); likewise, he holds that the preferences of competent judges are evidence of what is a more desirable pleasure. He takes a similar approach to basic epistemological principles in the System of Logic. Judgements about what is desirable are normative judgements about a particular species of value: Mill is not saying that what constitutes the value of a pleasure is the preference, actual or ideal, of competent judges, still less that well-being consists in desire satisfaction.

So I think the real interpretative issue lies directly between the traditional hedonistic reading of Mill’s idea of well-being, and the perfectionist reading Brink proposes.

What, then, does he mean by ‘perfectionism’? More explanation would have been useful. He does say that it “is not just a claim about what things cause happiness but also a claim about what happiness consists in” (p. xii). And later on he takes it to be the doctrine that happiness consists in the cultivation and exercise of one’s capacities to live a life of human excellence. The perfectionism he attributes to Mill is, in other words, not the claim that one should pursue personal excellence irrespective of happiness; it is rather the claim that excellence, or its pursuit, is what partly or wholly constitutes happiness.

The trouble is that these formulations could be consistent or inconsistent with a hedonist reading of Mill. As Brink notes, Mill often talks in ‘objective’ as well ‘subjective’ terms of pleasures; one can add that this links with his idea that activities can be ‘parts of’, not means to, happiness. So, for example, hill-walking is part of my happiness rather than a means to it; on the hedonistic reading what this means is that I don’t walk the hills as a means to something else, like health, say, or not only for that reason, but because I enjoy it in its own right. Happiness for me consists in a walk on the hills on a fine day. I am exercising various capacities, both mental and physical; the pleasure is in that exercise. In the same way, if (as in Mill’s example) virtue becomes a ‘part’ of my happiness, then among my reasons for acting virtuously will be the fact that I enjoy so acting. Here enjoyment and pleasure are to be understood subjectively. On the hedonistic reading when one calls something a pleasure in the objective sense one means that it (mostly, typically, etc.) gives pleasure in the subjective sense.

Also at work here is the ‘Aristotelian Principle’ that Rawls attributes to Mill,[1] according to which the most valuable forms of pleasure are achieved through development of one’s potentialities. Subjective pleasure or enjoyment, on this reading, is the only property that makes a thing desirable in its own right. However, to estimate how desirable it is one must see that its desirability is determined in two dimensions -- quality (understood as kind) and quantity. This is the hedonistic reading of Mill’s perfectionism: what makes development of one’s potential desirable is the access to more desirable forms of pleasure that it opens up.

In contrast, Brink takes the perfectionism he ascribes to Mill to be a rival to hedonism. He does not deny that a case can be made for a hedonistic reading, but he holds that not everything Mill says is consistent with it, and, further, that the non-hedonistic version of perfectionism makes greater systematic sense of Mill’s ethical and political standpoint.

Where do we find in Mill’s writings inconsistency with hedonism? Brink thinks, as others have, that the idea of higher pleasures poses problems for hedonism (pp. 52-55). I wasn’t clear why he thought this, given that he gets so much right about that idea. What a hedonist is committed to, qua hedonist, is presumably only that the desirability, in its own right, of a pleasure is determined solely by its intrinsic properties as a pleasure. So Mill must hold that the quality of a pleasure is just as much an intrinsic property as its intensity. This is not implausible: the intentional content of a pleasure, for example, is an intrinsic, and indeed an essential, property. Whether or not Mill’s ‘two-dimensional’ conception of the desirability of a pleasure is plausible, it is not inconsistent.

But perhaps the point on which Brink places greatest weight is that a close reading of Mill shows that he holds, of a number of activities, that we “take pleasure in these activities because we recognize their value; they are not valuable because they are pleasurable” (p. 56). Among the passages he quotes is the one at Utilitarianism II 6 where “Mill explains the fact that competent judges prefer activities that exercise their rational capacities by appeal to their sense of dignity” (p. 56).

Whether this explanation of their preferences is consistent with hedonism goes deep into the nature and diversity of value. A key point is that Mill nowhere asserts, as far as I know, that every kind of value is to be measured hedonically: the hedonic measure is appropriate in determining how desirable a thing is. It does not follow that how admirable an activity, or a form of life, etc. is should be measured hedonically. On the contrary, by Mill’s naturalistic criterion, one would expect the ‘evidence’ for how admirable a thing is to be a matter of how much we admire it, not how much we desire it. Pursuing the naturalistic path further, there is then the question of how much, and when, we desire what we admire. It is not a simple matter. Still it is perfectly legitimate for Mill to suggest that an activity that we are proud of is one that, in that respect at least, we desire more than an activity we are ashamed of, for example, because it strikes us as undignified or in general disadmirable. And perhaps it is just a fact about human beings, or at least the ones with developed capacities, that rationality is one of the things they admire. Psychological facts of this kind could underlie the Aristotelian principle. So Mill’s appeal to dignity is not inconsistent with hedonism, when that is understood as a doctrine about happiness or about what is desirable, even though to spell it out he would have to venture further than he does into questions about the varieties of value and their grounding in the various sentiments.

Of course, to say that Mill’s hedonistic perfectionism is internally consistent is not to say it is correct. There are objections to be made to it other than that of inconsistency. However, what of Brink’s other thrust, that a pure perfectionist reading of Mill makes more sense of his ethics and politics? Well, the question of whether happiness is to be understood in hedonistic-perfectionist or purely perfectionist terms is intrinsically important and interesting. But from the standpoint of someone interested mainly in Mill’s social and political philosophy it may well not seem that important. On either reading, the features transmitted to Mill’s views on democracy and liberty will be similar, and the effect, in comparison to contemporary trends in liberalism, quite distinctive. Either way, Mill stands out as a perfectionist liberal (in a broad sense of perfectionism), with consequent worries about democracy -- not as a liberal of the kind now more common, who takes democracy for granted but requires neutrality from the state. Brink discusses this contrast in §72.

This difference is, to be sure, as much a matter of Mill’s utilitarianism as of his perfectionism. One might be a perfectionist, hedonistic or pure, but quarrel with the utilitarianism. However in the three chapters Brink devotes to Mill’s utilitarianism he is more concerned to interpret than to agree or disagree. As he reasonably says (p. 133), assessing the plausibility of utilitarianism is beyond the scope of his study; his concern is, rather, to find the version of utilitarianism that can be attributed to Mill. He does an excellent job of that. I end by raising just one question.

In Utilitarianism V, Mill holds that to say an action is morally wrong is to say that doing it should incur blame, or punishment over and above blame. It is also plausible, as Brink suggests, to read Mill as an act utilitarian about ‘objective’ rightness. Here ‘right’ action is understood as action there is most (‘objective’) reason to do. Brink thinks these two views inconsistent. I could not see why. True, on this reading Mill cannot hold, absent very implausible empirical assumptions, that the action there is most reason to do is thereby morally obligatory. But Mill seems committed to denying this in any case -- in view, for example, of what he often says, very decidedly, about supererogation. I am not suggesting that Mill gets the concept of moral wrongness right (though the objections Brink raises to it in §27 did not strike me as compelling). But as a matter of interpretation, act utilitarianism about ‘objective’ reasons plus the ‘blameworthiness’ view about moral wrongness seems to me to be consistent and to fit the texts pretty well.

[1] John Rawls, Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy, Cambridge, Mass.: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 2007, pp. 269, 300.