Mind and Cosmos: Why the Materialist Neo-Darwinian Conception of Nature is Almost Certainly False

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Thomas Nagel, Mind and Cosmos: Why the Materialist Neo-Darwinian Conception of Nature is Almost Certainly False, Oxford University Press, 2012, 130pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199919758.

Reviewed by John Dupré, University of Exeter


As the title and subtitle make clear, Thomas Nagel's recent project is an extremely ambitious one; it is especially ambitious to attempt to tackle it in a very short book. Nagel thinks there is a wide consensus among philosophers and scientists around a certain view of nature, the 'materialist neo-Darwinian' conception, but that this view has proved radically inadequate. It has failed, Nagel argues, to provide adequate explanations for mind and for value, and these things are so central to an adequate picture of the cosmos that such failures constitute a fatal flaw. Of course, it is not just that no adequate explanation has yet been given, but rather, in Nagel's view, that there are systematic reasons for suspecting that none could be given. Nagel does not develop this argument from a religious perspective. Indeed, he makes it clear that theistic assumptions have no appeal for him. Instead, insofar as he has a positive alternative to offer, it is that we should add a measure of naturalistic teleology to our stock of explanations, a bias of nature 'towards the marvelous' (most marvelously, leading to ourselves).

I found this book frustrating and unconvincing. Much of the frustration derives from a difficulty in knowing what exactly its target is and, when this is clear, why. The subtitle offers us materialism and the neo-Darwinian conception of nature. Starting with the latter, I would have doubted that, except perhaps in the hands of Daniel Dennett, neo-Darwinism is as central to a conception of nature as the title suggests. Darwinism, neo- or otherwise, is an account of the relations between living things past and present and of their ultimate origins, full of fascinating problems in detail, but beyond any serious doubt in general outline. This lack of doubt derives not, as Nagel sometimes insinuates, from a prior commitment to a metaphysical view -- there are theistic Darwinists as well as atheistic, naturalists and supernaturalists -- but from overwhelming evidence from a variety of sources: biogeography, the fossil record, comparative physiology and genomics, and so on. Nagel offers no arguments against any of this, and indeed states explicitly that he is not competent to do so. His complaint is that there are some explanatory tasks that he thinks evolution should perform that he thinks it can't. But as far as an attack that might concern evolutionists, they will feel, to borrow the fine phrase of former British minister, Dennis Healey, as if they had been savaged by a sheep.

Materialism is something quite different. In Nagel's mind, at least, it is almost synonymous with reductionism, the term with which he most commonly refers to the views he opposes. He writes, for instance, 'I will use the terms "materialism" or "materialist naturalism" to refer to one side of this conflict, and "antireductionism" to refer to the other side' (p. 13). This reflects an earlier statement that 'among the scientists and philosophers who do express views about the natural order as a whole, reductive materialism is widely assumed to be the only serious possibility'. This is amazing stuff. The only citation in favour of this is to Steven Weinberg's Dreams of a Final Theory, a somewhat ironic choice given the open disdain for philosophy Weinberg expresses in that book. But actually it is hard to think of an appropriate citation from a philosopher. Nagel expresses a view that was popular among philosophers of science half a century ago, and has been in decline ever since. It is a view that is perhaps still common among philosophers of mind (David Chalmers much discussed book The Conscious Mind (1996), for example, bases its argument for dualism on a similar view of materialism), but reductionism has been almost entirely rejected by philosophers actually engaged with the physical and biological sciences: it simply has no interesting relation to the diversity of things that scientists actually do.

So here is the first problem. Reductionism can be understood as a metaphysical thesis, typically based on an argument that if there is only material stuff in the world (no spooky stuff), then the properties of stuff must ultimately explain everything. This is a controversial thesis, much debated by philosophers. But what the last 50 years of work in the philosophy of science has established is that this kind of reductionism has little relevance to science. Even if it turned out that most scientists believed something like this (which I find incredible) this would be a psychological oddity, not a deep insight about science. A more sensible materialism goes no further than the rejection of spooky stuff: whatever kinds of stuff there may turn out to be and whatever they turn out to do, they are, as long as this turning out is empirically grounded, ipso facto not spooky. Such a materialism is quite untouched by Nagel's arguments.

Why does Nagel believe that materialism has to have this reductive character? It appears to be because he believes that 'everything about the world can . . . be understood' (p. 17), and that 'rational intelligibility is at the root of the natural order'. It would not be an exaggeration to say that for Nagel, if science can't come up with a theory of everything it has, in some deep sense, failed. Nagel is thus, in effect, committed a priori to reductionism; the failure of reductionism is therefore the failure of science. Perhaps the most charitable reading of the position is that Nagel is trying to revive rationalism for an atheistic age. He doesn't, however, make it look like an encouraging project.

The main substance of the book, once this strange philosophical backdrop has been sketched, is an argument for the irreducibility to 'materialist neo-Darwinism' of consciousness, cognition and values, each of which gets a chapter. Consciousness is, of course, familiar territory for Nagel, whose classic paper 'What is it like to be a bat?' has been a major factor in the founding of the now thriving consciousness industry. Given the special status and mystery (even spookiness) attributed to consciousness within this movement, it is not surprising that it has given rise to some curious metaphysical views, most famously David Chalmers's dualism alluded to above. There are increasing stirrings of doubt about this project and even a few, like this reviewer, who doubt whether there is anything it is like to be a bat (see Hacker 2002; Dupré 2009), but this is not the place to pursue that argument. What seems to me beyond any serious question is that the results and insights gained by the vast quantities of philosophical and quasi-philosophical work on consciousness in the last few decades is hardly comparable with the successes that stand to the credit of evolution.

The starting point of Nagel's strategy is that if the general reductionist project is to be successful, then it must be shown how consciousness/cognition/value can be integrated into the materialist worldview. Prima facie these things are not material. The materialist story about how material came to possess these entities or qualities is evolution. So if evolution cannot account for consciousness/cognition/value, it is fatally injured. Let's assume for the sake of argument that we accept the philosophical framing of the issue. The next thing is to give an account of these topics that blocks the evolutionary explanation. Suffice it to say that in each case the account given is controversial. Most obviously this is true for the moral realism that Nagel defends. Here he is quite clear that the argument could also run from the truth of evolution to the falsity of moral realism, a direction taken, as Nagel notes, by Sharon Street (2006). I have already mentioned the possibility of doubts about Nagel's take on consciousness. Given the controversial status of these analyses Nagel's subtitle should at least be amended to 'why the materialist neo-Darwinian conception of nature might possibly be false'.

The case of cognition, finally, brings out most strikingly Nagel's rationalism. Nagel thinks that reason gives us insights into reality that evolution cannot account for. Whereas perception gives us a view of the world mediated by a 'mental effect' that it causes in me, something that emerged to serve my evolutionary interests, reason gives me direct, unmediated insight into the world. If I realise that my beliefs are in contradiction, I know directly that one of them is false (p. 82). These are deep waters, no doubt. My own views are, first, that the mediating mental effect in perception is a highly problematic entity, and second that surely logic is at least mediated by language. But here I will only repeat that we have surely not been offered anything harder to deny than the general truth of evolution.

Suppose, again counterfactually, that we accept Nagel's accounts of consciousness, cognition, and value, what would it take to show that beings with these capacities could not have evolved in the "neo-Darwinian" manner? How, for instance, can a collection of molecules evolve the ability to feel like something? I'll offer just one more diagnosis of what has gone wrong. Nagel is very impressed, like many before him and since, with the oddity of material stuff having experiences. But the explanation of mind does not, of course, lie in matter but in form. Of course matter must have the capacity to embody complex forms, as for instance the properties of carbon, oxygen, nitrogen and a few other elements that allow them to form complex organic polymers. It is then the relations that these forms make possible with other molecules and then up the scale of increasing complexity that underlie the emergence of the capacities that so impress us.

What can't evolution explain about all this that it ought to? Nagel constantly asserts that to explain the existence of consciousness, etc., evolution must not just show that they are possible, but also that they are likely, or to be expected. This is, I suppose, a further expression of his rationalism, the expectation of a certain kind of intelligibility. But still it seems to me poorly motivated. At the time of my birth it was very unlikely that I would several decades later be reviewing a book by a famous philosopher; but it is not mysterious that this eventually came about. The improbability has been declining rapidly for the last few decades. Just so with evolution. The evolution of reason may well be very unlikely indeed on a young, hot planet. It's a great deal more likely by the time there are highly social, if not yet rational, multicellular organisms with very complex nervous systems.

Nagel does not want to appeal to God and finds current evolutionary thinking in principle inadequate to account for central features of human existence. Yet he is committed to the intelligibility of the world we find ourselves in. So where can we go to provide more satisfactory explanations? The only positive suggestion that Nagel offers to solve the pseudo-problems he has devised is that there may be teleological laws, laws that 'bias towards the marvelous'. What is the evidence for these strange bits of legislation? Only that they would make the appearance of complex creatures such as ourselves, marvels that we are, more likely. I have never felt more proud to be an empiricist.

A final point. I have myself argued that it is a serious mistake to allow fear of creationists and other obscurantists to discourage discussion of the weaknesses and unanswered questions in evolutionary theory. Nagel has no fear of such people and expresses a considerable sympathy with intelligent design. On the basis of his understanding of evolution, he considers that the rejection of their criticisms of evolution is 'manifestly unfair' (p. 10). (This may, of course, reflect on either the understanding or the unfairness.) He just personally feels an aversion to the theistic perspective. The title of the book, however, all too readily interpreted as announcing the falsity of Darwinism, will certainly lend comfort (and sell a lot of copies) to the religious enemies of Darwinism. Notwithstanding my caution about being unduly influenced by such people, this seems unfortunate when so easily avoidable.


Chalmers, David (1996). The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory. New York: Oxford University Press.

Dupré, John (2009). "Hard and Easy Questions about Consciousness", in Wittgenstein and Analytic Philosophy: Essays for P.M. S. Hacker, eds. Hans-Johann Glock and John Hyman. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 228-249.

Hacker, P. M. S. (2002). "Is there anything it is like to be a bat?". Philosophy 77: 157-174.

Street, Sharon (2006). "A Darwinian dilemma for realist theories of value". Philosophical Studies 127: 109-166.