Mind and Supermind

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Keith Frankish, Mind and Supermind, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 270pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521 812038.

Reviewed by Dominic Murphy, California Institute of Technology


Keith Frankish thinks the arguments about the nature of folk psychology remain unresolved because both sides are correct about different aspects of the mind. Frankish claims that folk psychology has two theoretical cores, which provide the frameworks needed to understand the two different types of minds -- basic minds and superminds -- that humans possess. Having argued for this point in outline, Frankish defends it by arguing that several outstanding disputes in the philosophy of mind can be resolved by recasting the issues in his terms. He takes us on an interesting and stimulating survey of the conceptual issues, but the discussion rushes through a number of debates that should be taken at less speed and spelled out more clearly. It will be hard to follow if one is not already familiar with the literature, but it does illustrate very well the connections between various positions on folk psychology, rationality, and the concept of belief. And the upshot is clear enough.

The overall picture distinguishes what Frankish calls either the strand 1 mind or the basic mind from the strand 2 mind, or supermind. (The book would be easier to follow if it consistently used just one of these pairs of neologisms.) The basic mind is non-conscious and contains passively formed beliefs that come in degrees, cannot be actively controlled, and do not involve language. As a reasoning system, it is well described by Bayesian decision theory. The supermind, on the other hand, is conscious, and its beliefs can be actively formed and controlled, expressed in a natural language, and are held or not without qualification. As a reasoning system, it is "classical". (This term is not defined, but it seems to mean syllogistic or otherwise subject to logical, rather than probabilistic, appraisal.) The supermind is realized in the basic mind, in the sense that generalizations about states of the supermind are made true by generalizations about underlying basic states. The result is a very strong commitment not just to the idea that folk psychology quantifies over real entities, but that folk psychology, properly understood, is correct in almost every particular about the nature of those entities, and that the nature of belief is a conceptual, rather than an empirical, matter.

Frankish draws attention to many genuine tensions in folk psychology. But I am skeptical that all the tensions can be resolved in his preferred way, by two neat conceptual clusters. Frankish believes that tensions in folk psychology reflect an underlying distinction in our mental nature, and that folk psychology can be divided without remainder, as it were, into two unified theories with different, and correct, ontological commitments. I don't think this is plausible. Although the conflicts Frankish discusses are genuine, it is hard to share his confidence that they can be resolved by dividing the properties of beliefs into those possessed by basic beliefs and those of the superbeliefs. I think that the conflicts cross-cut each other, and that the same mental state can have properties that are, in Frankish's scheme, characteristics of radically different natural kinds.

According to Frankish, for instance, conscious belief is binary -- you either believe something or you don't -- whereas basic belief comes in degrees and is always nonconscious: "our degrees of confidence are not matters of immediate conscious awareness" (p.23). I think this is just false. Not only do I feel more confident about some things than others, I think its possible to experience changes in one's degree of belief in a given proposition -- going down as evidence of its falsehood is presented, for instance, and going back up as one thinks of a rebuttal to that counterevidence. Also, our patterns of folk-psychological explanation seem sensitive to the strengths with which other people hold their beliefs, including their conscious, explicitly affirmed ones.

Conversely, the restriction of flat-out belief to the conscious mind seems unmotivated by anything in folk psychology, since our attributions of unconscious beliefs to people seem just as susceptible to a binary interpretation as our attributions of conscious beliefs. Frankish might be correct that we have two separate models of belief, but it seems very unlikely that they correspond to the distinction between conscious and unconscious beliefs. Frankish, thinks, in fact, that conscious and unconscious thoughts are radically different things -- but folk psychology seems to use the same explanatory devices for both conscious and unconscious beliefs.

Frankish denies this. He argues (ch. 2, section 3.2) that ordinary belief-desire explanation can cite beliefs either as "sustaining causes", which are causally relevant standing states or dispositions, or as "dynamic causes", which are events that produce actions directly. He argues that "austere functionalists" like Dennett and Davidson, because they deny that belief-desire talk normally refers to discrete mental items, must hold that beliefs can only ever be sustaining causes and never dynamic ones. But this view is hard to find in austere functionalism. It is correct that Dennett, for example, thinks that belief ascription is true in virtue of the subject being in one of a large number of causally equivalent physical states, regardless of whether the content of the belief is explicitly represented. But he also believes that the state, whatever it is, can be a dynamic cause.

In both of these cases, Frankish has hit upon a genuine tension, or at least tolerance of ambiguity, in folk psychology. There are indeed reasons for thinking of belief as binary and for thinking of it as coming in degrees, and we do advert to both sustaining and dynamic causes in folk psychological explanation (as in causal explanation more generally). But there seems little reason to follow Frankish in supposing that these distinctions, let alone all the other distinctions that he goes over, fall into two neatly demarcated psychological kinds.

So far we have a standoff between Frankish and the theorist who just thinks that folk psychology lacks a clearly defined concept of belief. We might resolve this standoff by looking at the uses to which Frankish puts his machinery in the remainder of the book. This involves two main discussions. There is an account of reasoning based on a variation on L.J. Cohen's idea of "acceptance". And there is a discussion of the ontological commitments of folk psychology. In both cases, the folk picture is supposed to be vindicated by showing how it is naturally elaborated into a sophisticated theory that employs the mind/supermind distinction.

The first application of the two-strand framework is an account of the conscious mind as a "premising machine": sometimes this is presented as a theory of conscious deliberation or practical reason -- the sort of thing that could serve as the cognitive component of a naturalistic philosophy of science. Other remarks (e.g., p.105, 118-120) suggest it is a theory of conscious thought in general. The basic idea, adapted from Cohen, appeals to the notion of acceptance. Acceptance of a content is a commitment to use it in inference, even though one may not believe it: lawyers accept that their clients are innocent, even when that innocence is frankly unbelievable. Hence, "to possess a supermind is to be disposed to engage in certain conscious inferential activities which are the precursors of overt action" (p.201). The account of premising and its differences from belief is suggestive and interesting, and the criticisms of other views are often clear and powerful. However, I think that little is gained by introducing the mind/supermind framework as a positive theory. Frankish thinks that superbeliefs are a subspecies of acceptance -- they are acceptances that have general, rather than restricted, use in reasoning and are held with high confidence. But because he insists that superbeliefs are different from basic beliefs, the result is a very complicated theory of reasoning on which our actions may have two different, competing explanations that cite beliefs -- basic beliefs or superbeliefs, which are the doxastic version of acceptances, which are a different thing again. And the gains don't compensate for this complication.

Superbeliefs are held with high confidence. Because of this, Frankish faces familiar problems about the failure of rational confidence to be preserved over logical conjunction, as illustrated by the paradox of the preface. These problems beset attempts to take graded belief as primitive and derive binary belief from it, as belief that meets a certain confidence threshold. Frankish has no solution, and ends up insisting (p.139) that we have to live with the tension that the puzzles raise, since it reflects incompatible demands on our concept of rationality. That might be correct, but if it is, why not just take the graded conception of belief as primary and keep to a single concept of belief? Frankish dissents from proposals along these lines, but seems to offer no way to solve the problems that ensue. His extra machinery is complicating things to no purpose.

The problem is that Frankish insists that the supermind is realized in the basic mind and hence inherits some of its properties: what we can say about doxastic acceptance is constrained by the nature of basic belief. But why do this? Perhaps the difficulties could be avoided by just arguing that the basic mind and the supermind are completely different, with largely independent physical bases in the nervous system. (Some dual-process theories of reasoning take this line.) Frankish never discusses this proposal, nor states why the supermind must be realized in the basic mind. In fact, the relation between mind and supermind is never spelled out. All the work is done by the notion of realization, but no details are given. In particular, despite some speculations about evolution, development, and the role of language, there is no theory about how a creature with just a basic mind gets to have a supermind too.

So, if folk psychology regards basic beliefs and superbeliefs as very different kinds, why insist that they share a physical base? Frankish doesn't say. But perhaps part of the answer is found in his discussion of folk psychology's empirical commitments. Frankish denies that the folk psychology of the supermind makes any assumptions about how the mind/brain is organized. It may be that this denial is not compatible with the claim that the supermind has a distinct neural realization.

Why make the denial? It is the core of Frankish's response to a familiar worry. Folk psychology hypothesizes that propositions and concepts are modular -- they can be individually stored, acquired, lost and causally potent. This seems to saddle folk psychology with empirical bets about "cognitive architecture". In particular, it seems committed to the view that the brain can store information in discrete chunks. But intentional realists, including Frankish, do not want to say that cognitive architecture is discoverable a priori, by mere reflection on folk thought. Nor do they want to say that folk psychology could be refuted by finding out the facts about cognitive architecture. So how to retain the thesis about modularity of thought without making a parallel claim about cognitive architecture?

You could just deny that folk-psychological hypotheses have any architectural upshot at all. Frankish thinks this is true of the basic mind, whose implementation in the brain is a matter for neuroscience alone. But he insists that propositional and conceptual modularity is indeed a core commitment of supermental folk psychology. However, if the supermind is realized in the basic mind rather than in an independent neural substrate, it ultimately has whatever neural architecture the basic mind has.

The idea seems to be that modularity is indeed a commitment of the folk psychology of the supermind, but that this is unproblematic since modularity at that level is not an architectural hypothesis at all. Explaining rational behavior involves independently assessable contents but not commitments to any thesis about neurological organization. Modularity turns out to be a property of the mind, realized in natural language (in which we think) but not of its neural implementation. This is perfectly plausible, but it could have been stated without the mind/supermind machinery as a Dennettian claim about the neutrality of intentional psychology on matters of implementation. If more is intended, then I don't understand the proposal.

I have complained, then, that the supermind idea is not an attractive regimentation of folk psychology, but perhaps that just shows that intuitions may clash. I also find this a needlessly complex theory. Much more detail is needed to show why the complications are necessary. The natural way to do that is to show that the view might be scientifically fruitful. But -- except for a two-page discussion of autism at the end and some references to decision theory -- there is no science in the book. If a philosophical proposal is supposed to help us understand the mind, it should show how scientific inquiries could be illuminated, motivated or otherwise advanced by adopting it.