Mind and World in Aristotle’s De Anima

Mind And World In Aristotle S De Anima

Sean Kelsey, Mind and World in Aristotle’s De Anima, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 181pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108832915.

Reviewed by Klaus Corcilius, University of Tübingen


This is a short, rich, very unconventional, and in many ways illuminating, but also highly controversial book. It proposes two things: a new perspective on Aristotle’s theory of human cognition in the De anima and a very bold theory of how cognition and its objects relate in that theory. Kelsey raises two questions: by being what does the perceptual soul account for perception as a principle? And: by being what does the thinking part of the soul account for intelligent thinking as a principle? The mark of Kelsey’s approach is that he asks these questions not as modern philosophers would typically do when they investigate how cognition “works” in receiving information from the environment etc., but by asking what perception and intelligence are so as to get things rightly, i.e., how they successfully cognize beings as they really are, both in their perceptual appearance and in their unqualified being. These questions and their focus on the problem of successful cognition, as Kelsey is right to point out, are, even if closely related to, different from the specifically modern questions of intentionality and consciousness (15). His answer, in a nutshell, is that cognition for Aristotle is, in a way to be discussed, the measure of the beings it cognizes. Perception is the measure of perceptible beings and intelligence the measure of intelligible beings, and the very being of things in the world is to some extent dependent on the nature of cognition. However, before we delve into the book’s argument, a cautionary note is in place. No one should take Kelsey’s claim as a contribution to the scholarly analysis of what Aristotle writes in his De anima expressis verbis. That would be a misunderstanding. Kelsey’s book is rather a philosophical meditation. It is an essay about the deeper philosophical framework implicit in the inquiry of De anima (10), which is at the level of the grand scheme of things, where the relation between the object and the subject of cognition is defined. I shall go through the main argument of this unusually dense and rich book very roughly. Unavoidably, I will miss out on many important points of detail.

Chapter 1 discusses the explanatory ambition of Aristotle’s theory, mostly by drawing on the methodological statements towards the beginning of De anima; chapter 2 prepares the ground for the argument by showing how Aristotle took issue specifically with his predecessors’ theories’ inability to explain the cognition of things as they are; chapter 3 interprets De anima II 5 as offering a basic framework for how to think of perception in such a way as to allow for successful cognition. This framework is a “grammar of perceiving” (58) that treats perception as an affection by a perceptual object without thereby turning it into a change of the perceiver (as that would spoil its objectivity); chapter 4 takes a step back and discusses how cognition and its objects relate to each other so as to make successful cognition possible. This relation, argues Kelsey, has to be a relation of affinity between cognition and its objects antecedent to cognition. It consists, like all such affinities, in a likeness in “some quality or form” (74). In order to bring home his point in the broadest possible way, he offers discussions of various examples from other, non-cognitive domains (they are: nourishment, friendship, and affection generally). The upshot is that things, in order to interact not merely by chance, have to be somehow alike in their very nature.

With its conception of measure (metron), chapter 5 presents the fulcrum of Kelsey’s positive account of Aristotle’s theory of cognition. He starts by arguing that measures quite generally are akin to what they measure but that they are asymmetrically so: the very being of the measured objects is determined in relation to what they are measured by. Measures are in this sense conceptually prior to what they measure. In this asymmetric way, he says, measures are the “forms of the forms” of the objects they measure (with allusion to the famous passage in De anima III 8, 432a2–3, 85). To understand this properly, two qualifications are required. First, Kelsey does not say that measures determine the kind of quantity or quality (or form) of the objects they determine but only their particular quantity, quality (or form, 87–90). Thus, the inch as a measure of length does not determine what length is (that would be absurd) but only the particular quantity of length, i.e., one or two or any other number of inches. The second qualification is based on a passage in Met. X 1, 1053b4–8, where Aristotle distinguishes between quantitative and qualitative measures. Qualitative measures, on Kelsey’s conception of them, are what we may call a kind of sortal analogue of quantitative measures: while the latter make us know how much or how many the measured are, the former are that “by which we primarily know of what sort (poion) something is” (91). This qualitative conception of measures will do important work in the ensuing theory of the objects of perception.

Kelsey focuses on the basic objects of perception, i.e., the modally exclusive qualities of the special senses, colours for sight, sounds for the sense of hearing and so on. As Aristotle conceives of them (as of all qualities) as lying on continuous spectra “bounded at both ends by contrary extremes”, such qualities will be different according to how close or distant they are with respect to either of the contrary extremes on the spectrum. For example, a colour will be different in accordance with how close or distant its position is with respect to the extremes on the colour spectrum, dark and light. So much for what Kelsey regards to be the nature of perceptible qualities independently of perception (in this, I take it, these qualities are analogous to the length of extended objects before they are quantitatively measured by the inch that tells us how long they are). But since Aristotle also maintains that it is part of the nature of perceptual qualities to appear to us the way they really are (this is how Kelsey interprets passages like De anima II 6, 418a15, where Aristotle says that the perception of the modally exclusive objects is always or almost always true), namely as endowed with qualities we perceive them as having and that we—but not Aristotle—would regard as qualities that are relative or subjective or somehow dependent on our sensibilities (examples are “cold” or “warm” temperatures, “dark” or “light” colours, and “high” and “low” sounds), there is an additional dimension to the nature of perceptual qualities that is not independent from perception. Kelsey claims that the nature of these qualities is grounded in the fact that the spectra of perceptible qualities are naturally “divided” by the mean positions between their contrary extremes, and that this division creates two “sides” on the spectrum and therewith an additional sort of perceptual qualities over and above the aforementioned spectrum of qualities. For now, as each perceptual quality is located on one or the other “side” of the spectrum (93–94), each perceptual quality will also exhibit the qualities that it has in virtue of being thus and so positioned with respect to the mean. And this makes perceptual qualities not only colours or temperatures and so on, but also “dark” or “light” and “warm” or “cold” and so on: Perceptual qualities, already by themselves and in their own nature, exhibit features that are relative to the mean position on the relevant spectrum and hence they are already themselves endowed with relative qualities which we—but not Aristotle—would deem subjective or relative to our sensibilities.

It is Kelsey’s thesis that Aristotle defines the mean values determining this set of relative qualities of perceptual objects “by sensibility itself” (discarding in a footnote as “hopeless” other interpretative options, in particular the option that the mean values between extremes on a qualitative spectrum result simply from the composition of the contrary qualities themselves, i.e., without reference to perception, 95; see below). He writes:

if it belongs to dark colours to look dark, or to cold temperatures to feel cold, or to low pitches to sound low, the cause of its belonging to those qualities to appear in those ways must ultimately lie in the nature of those qualities. [. . . . And] the cause of its belonging to those qualities to appear in those ways lies in the relationship of those qualities to the nature of sensibility. (113)

Kelsey sees this conceptual dependency of perceptual qualities on perception (“sensibility”) implied in Aristotle’s doctrine that each of the qualities on a given spectrum in-between the two extremes is “somehow composed of” the extreme values (Met. X 7, 1057b26–34, 94—but I found that the discussion of Aristotle’s doctrine already assumed Kelsey’s theory that each spectrum is naturally divided into two). Here, he argues, lies a fundamental difference between our neutral, more scientific way and Aristotle’s way of accounting for perceptual cognition: Aristotle—unlike us—would not have regarded it as a problem that certain aspects of perceptual qualities are relative to our sensibility so that sensibility somehow becomes part of the “very fabric of the universe” (95).

Chapter 6, parts of which I have already covered, applies his doctrine of the two-sidedness of each perceptual spectrum to perceptual cognition. Kelsey here relies on Aristotle’s definition of the power of perception in De anima II 12 as a mean proportion (or ratio) of perceptible qualities. As we have just seen, the reason why perceptible qualities naturally appear the way they are (namely already in themselves as cold or warm and so on, which is to say as more on one side of their relevant spectra than on the other) is that the mean values that determine these qualities are ultimately defined by the nature of perception (“sensibility”) itself (115). And the reason why we perceptually discriminate them in this way is that the nature of our power of perception is that very mean value: This is how we qualitatively measure of “what sort” each of these qualities is, namely as being “excesses”, i.e., closer to, or more distant from, the mean. This, Kelsey argues, is how perception qualitatively measures its objects and how the nature of perception is “somehow” the form of its objects (echoing De anima III 8, 432a2–3, 120).

Chapters 7 and 8 discuss “intelligence” (his rendering of nous). Here, prima facie the difficulties for Kelsey seem unsurmountable. What should the commonality or likeness in form between the cognitive power and its object consist in? And in which sense can this power be regarded as a measure of its objects? After all, Aristotle defines the power of nous as the mere potentiality of its objects, a potentiality which is supposed to be none of the beings at all before it thinks. Chapter 7 starts with the objects of intelligence—essences—arguing first that essences are units and as such measures and principles of cognition (128) of the things they measure. So here things seem to be the opposite from what they seemed to be in the case of perception where not the objects, but the power of perception was supposed to be the measure. Second, however, and on the basis of Aristotle’s dictum that in thinking, insofar as it thinks its objects, “thinking/understanding and its object are the same” (Met. XII 9, 1075a4–5), Kelsey turns the tables, arguing that since for Aristotle cognition and its object are the same in actual thinking, everything intelligible is also intelligent (130). His argument relies on the three following claims (which Aristotle makes at different stages of his argument in De anima):

(i) intelligence is intelligible.

(ii) all intelligible objects have something in common (insofar as they are intelligible), namely matterlessness.

(iii) intelligence has nothing in common with anything else.

Here, (ii) calls for an explanation. Kelsey makes the important point that the intelligibility of the essences of things is the result and product of the work of the intellect and that essences for that reason are actually intelligible only once they are prepared in that way by the intellect. Before they are made actually intelligible, essences are not actually intelligible, while the immediate result of that preparation is that they are actually known. Hence, there cannot be actually intelligible objects which are not actually known. That should however not suggest that essences not currently known by the intellect are not intelligible at all; they still are potentially intelligible, i.e., they are such that they can be prepared by the intellect and made intelligible. This preparation consists in the intelligence’s making them clear and distinct by “separating” or “dividing” them from whatever they are not, i.e., from matter (137) and from other things and features they are “mixed” with (133–35). Taken in this way, namely as the result of analysis and the entire process of abstraction from non-essential features (taken in the widest possible sense, Kelsey is cutting a very long story short here), matterlessness emerges as the key feature both of essences as the objects of intelligence and of intelligence itself, and this feature is also sufficient for both: “there is nothing without matter that is not ‘being understood’ (or “known” noumenon), and nothing being understood or known that is not ‘understanding’ (nooun)” (135). This is an important disanalogy with perceptual cognition, where object and subject of perception can occur separately from each other, and it allows Kelsey to defuse the trenchant objections Frank Lewis once raised against Aristotle’s claim that in thinking subject and object of thinking coincide. What is more, given (i) plus the account of intelligibility as coinciding with actual understanding or knowledge, each act of intelligence will also be an act of “understanding of understanding” (noêsis noêseôs, 138). However, the thesis of the identity of the act of understanding not only with its object but also with its subject—intelligence—should not been taken to imply that when an intelligent agent knows, say, the essence of triangle, she will be the essence of triangle. For triangles are only intelligible to the extent to which they are “understood”, which is to say that the thinking of the essence of triangles, though separate and identical with the act of its understanding, is still but a “creature of intelligence” (140–41).

Chapter 8 states what the affinity or commonality of intelligence and its objects consists in and in what way not only the objects of the intellect but also intelligence is supposed to be the measure of its objects. Kelsey argues that the commonality of intelligible objects with the intellect consists in the fact that they are separate (or unmixed, simple, indivisible or units), which, as we have seen, he takes to be equivalent with their distinctness and clarity as it results from “separating” and “dividing”. This clarity and distinctness, he says, is the “form of [intelligible] forms” that intelligence consists in and that also makes its objects intelligible (again echoing De anima III 8, 432a2–3, 154). Here one would have liked to hear more. How does intelligence measure its objects? According to Kelsey, intelligence reveals itself as the measure of intelligible things in the “character of the activity [of thinking intelligible objects] in which we find satisfaction or ‘repose’”. This is the case when we have “arrived at a result in which [our thought] is willing to abide” (154), which is to say when we are intellectually satisfied with our research and do not feel any urge to further continue trying to make things intelligible. Kelsey then defends his view against the objection of subjectivism: it is not anybody’s intellectual satisfaction that measures success but the satisfaction of the person who has internalized the standards specific to the discipline; that is the person who has realized the nature of the cognitive states in question, the nature of sensibility as such (162–63): cuique in arte sua credendum.

In a short conclusion, Kelsey continues to defend his claims against a subjectivist reading and also against the objection that they turn Aristotle into some sort of idealist philosopher: Yes, Aristotle may be regarded as some sort of idealist but only in the extremely deflationary sense that the actual objects of intelligence, insofar as they are actually intelligible, are actual operations of intelligence and hence, as Kelsey says, ideas (163–64).

This is surely a lot to chew on for a mere 164 pages of main text. To concentrate on the main point of the book’s stunning argument: Kelsey is certainly correct in saying that his measurement thesis is not the subjectivist one that anybody’s perception or intelligence is the measure of their corresponding objects. But he does claim that perceptible and intelligible things essentially are, in their very being, even if partly and only in the case of their basic objects (perceptual qualities and essences), relative to the nature of human cognition. One could then say that Kelsey proposes a deep-rooted mind-dependency with respect to the intrinsic nature of things perceptible and intelligible, the “world” in his parlance, if he—again, rightly, I think—did not reject the idea, famously promoted by Aryah Kosman and others, that cognition always involves consciousness. But the claim that the very being of things in the world, even if partly, is relative to the nature of human cognition remains. So, Kelsey is correct in saying that his measurement thesis about cognition is not a form of subjectivism; the very nature of cognition is not subjective, after all. But still—isn’t this cognition-dependency of cognitive objects a high price to pay for an account of successful cognition? And: do we have to accept Kelsey’s measurement thesis to make sense of Aristotle’s idea of successful cognition? Kelsey seems to think so. He presents his measurement thesis as the preferable choice over alternative conceptions of the mean between the contrary extremes on the relevant qualitative spectrum. On p95 he writes “to me the alternatives look hopeless (. . . .) That qualities are defined by the ‘ratios’ in which they are ‘composed’ of contraries? Since contraries are not quantities (are not divisible into parts), it is nonsense to say that anything is ‘composed out of them’ in literal ‘ratios’”. On this point I do not agree. We are discussing the nature of contraries on a given qualitative spectrum. Such contraries are qualities, which allow for the more and the less (Cat. 8, 10b26–11a14), and it seems to me that the argument in Metaphysics X 7 at least allows for the possibility that the ranges between extreme qualities are continuous and hence also in some sense divisible, indeed even ad infinitum. This is all the more likely since Aristotle has previously reduced the extreme values on qualitative scales to the “having” of a positive value on the one side and its complete privation on the other, which suggests that the intermediate values are more or less (gradable) privations of their positive values (Met. X 4).

If this is on the right track, nothing stands in the way of conceiving of the mean positions on qualitative spectra as resulting from the “composition” of ratios or portions of their own extreme values. I admit that the nature of that composition is unclear and it need not be taken in any literal sense, but what we have established so far suffices, in some sense, to “compose” qualities from proportions of qualitative extremes while keeping perception out of their definition, and thus to safeguard the pervasive object-centredness of Aristotle’s theory of cognition. And as far as “bright” and “dark”, “low” and “high” and other such allegedly relative perceptual qualities are concerned, it seems to me that Aristotle conceives of them as objective contrary values on their respective spectra. There is also no clear textual evidence in support of the thesis that Aristotle distinguishes between perception-relative and not perception-relative intrinsic qualities, nor is there evidence in the corpus for the thesis that there are “sides” intrinsic to qualitative spectra. These are all “theoretical investments” that go along with Kelsey’s measurement thesis of cognition. Similarly, his interpretation of the notion of “qualitative measure”, which, as he admits, is speculative (91), is not, I think, without its own problems. One might ask, for instance, why there should not be other such kinds of measures in accordance with other categories and by which we primarily know where or relative to what something is? But with this, Kelsey’s idea of an intrinsic connection between measurement and cognition rests on shaky ground. In short: the measurement thesis comes at a very high price, and it is not at all clear that we need to make these investments in order to be able to account for successful cognition in Aristotle. As far as intelligence is concerned, many of the highly insightful—if also highly dense—things Kelsey has to say about it seem entirely separable from his measurement thesis, while the statements that seek to positively connect the measurement thesis to what Aristotle says about intelligence are not very convincing. For instance, the thesis that our thought’s willingness to abide by a result which we find intellectually satisfying is the “measure” that we employ in gaining insight into essences (154–55: Think only of Heraclitus in EN VII 3, 1146b29–31, who is cited as an example for the thesis that some people have (subjective) conviction of their opinions that is “no less” than the conviction other people have of their knowledge. To say that it is not Heraclitus’ intellectual satisfaction but only the satisfaction of the person who has “internalized the standards specific to the discipline” in question does not settle the issue.

Kelsey suggests a very controversial thesis as to how the object and the subject of human cognition are related to each other in Aristotle’s philosophy. But he also offers a transparent line of reasoning as to why his interpretation is to be preferred over others. Kelsey’s book is a sincere attempt at coming to grips with Aristotle’s theory of cognition at the most profound level of analysis. It is a very philosophical book. But it is emphatically not a book for beginners in Aristotelian studies. Kelsey presupposes a great deal of familiarity with Aristotle. His arguments sometimes proceed with breathtaking speed and without taking the time to spell out all necessary steps. But there is much to be gained from the book, not only because of the depth of Kelsey’s perspective, but also in “lesser” matters. His reading of De anima II 5 in chapter 3, to mention just one instance, is in my view a serious blow to the literalism vs. spiritualism approach towards the chapter (see especially p52). Kelsey casts fresh and definitively philosophically very stimulating light on De anima. Everyone interested in the philosophy of Aristotle and the philosophy of mind will profit from reading it