Mind Ascribed: An Elaboration and Defence of Interpretivism

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Bruno Mölder, Mind Ascribed: An Elaboration and Defence of Interpretivism, John Benjamins, 2010, 293pp., $149.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789027252166.

Reviewed by Timothy Schroeder, Ohio State University


In Mind Ascribed, Bruno Mölder presents a deep defense of the doctrine of interpretivism in the philosophy of mind, both in general and in the form of his own version, called "ascription theory." We possess our mental states, he holds, because they are ascribable to us on the basis of suitable diverse evidence; and while our possession of mental states is metaphysically dependent on intentional ascriptions, a rigorous physicalism can still be defended. Before the end, Kim, Davidson, mental causation, perception, self-knowledge, and much more have all been discussed at length. The result is a compelling book.

Donald Davidson is the towering father-figure of interpretivism. His work has shaped how interpretivism is understood, attacked, and defended, and while there have been other innovative interpretivists (Daniel Dennett and John Haugeland, to name two), it is still Davidson's work that draws the lion's share of opponents and proponents. And as time has gone by, one effect of Davidson's enormous influence has been that interpretivism has come to be a largely static theory -- or so it has seemed from my admittedly limited vantage point. The layers of arguments and counter-arguments around Davidson's theory, initially a part of the theory's vitality, have come to form a hard crust around the original papers which carry on, unchanged, as the primary representatives of the entire research program.

In this context, Mölder's book seemed to me to be particularly refreshing. Mölder defends a form of interpretivism that challenges Davidson and Dennett at many points, that engages some of Davidson's longtime critics (especially Jaegwon Kim) in new ways, and that tackles some of the biggest intellectual challenges facing interpretivism, all in one unified package. The reader might not be convinced, but she will have reason to be impressed. This is not Davidson warmed over: this is a fresh start down the interpretivist path.

According to Mölder's ascription theory of mental state possession, for me to have the belief that P is for believing that P to be canonically ascribable to me; and so on for any mental state I might possess (171). A canonical ascription is a statement ascribing that state to me, which statement (1) approximates maximal coherence with the various sources of ascription, and (2) does not require revision (175). Sources of ascription, in turn, are all "publicly accessible and objective" forms of evidence (160) for the ordinary folk ascription of attitudes and comprise behavior, environmental stimuli, personal background, and other ascribable attitudes (161-2).

Thus, on Mölder's view, the belief that Nicholas lives in Berkeley is ascribable to me because the statement 'Tim believes that Nicholas lives in Berkeley' is one that is maximally coherent with other statements: that I said, "Nicholas lives just up the street" while in Berkeley, that I have been in visual contact with Nicholas in a home in Berkeley, that I was not drugged at the time, that in the past an intention to go to Berkeley to see Katie and Nicholas was attributable to me, and so on. This maximal coherence does not require maximal attribution of rationality to me, a point that Mölder emphasizes:

Instead of imputing internal consistency of thought and rationality to the subject, the ascription proceeds from the external sources of evidence about the subject… . the evidence from these sources should cohere, that is, it should point in the same direction, but this coherence can be compatible with ascribing internally incoherent thoughts to the subject. (121)

In being willing to give up on rationality as a key principle of interpretation, Mölder makes an interesting break from Davidson and Dennett, the two main interpretivists with whom he engages. He also rejects the Dennettian principle that we interpret organisms as desiring what they need to survive and reproduce: it is not a part of our ordinary practice when we ascribe mental states to others to consider the facts of natural selection.

Mölder appears to come out ahead by rejecting Davidson's well-known constraints on interpretation. Suppose I pick out a tasty cheese that is found on my right in the display case of a delicatessen. People have an irrational tendency to favor choosing things on their right sides, but I also have a rational tendency to choose tasty varieties of cheese over other things. In the situation, it appears compulsory to interpret me as acting for good reasons in this case, on any form of interpretivism that makes rationality an interpretive principle. Yet perhaps experiments would show that, in situations like mine, half of experimental subjects would fail to choose the tasty cheese when it is not found to their right sides. Such experiments would throw into doubt our certainty that I acted rationally, rather than through my non-rational mechanism favoring things on my right, in selecting the tasty cheese. But there seems no room for such doubt within Davidson's framework, and here Mölder does better.

Does he do better than Dennett? If our attitude-attribution practices come to be shaped by what we learn about natural selection, perhaps we will come to attribute desires for, e.g., sexual partners with bodily scents that carry the information that the person bearing the scent has quite a different set of immune factors from our own. We will never come to attribute such desires on the basis of everyday information, but we might well be coming to attribute them on the basis of Dennettian-style information about our evolutionary histories. Perhaps here Mölder does worse. But in any case, he re-enlivens the debate.

Returning to the details of Mölder's theory: ordinary practices of mental state ascription are central to the ascription theory (chapter 4), but actual attributions are not. On Mölder's view, what is important is what is ascribable. (This allows Mölder to break with Davidson on the interpretation of Swampman, for instance.) Yet Mölder is wary of any account of what is ascribable that relies on an ideal observer (172-3). This leads him to hold that what is ascribable is what would be ascribed by people with ordinary cognitive capacities, presented with all the sources of evidence that Mölder takes to be relevant (in short, all the sources of evidence we use every day in attributing attitudes), who are doing as well as such people can be expected to do to maximize their coherence in ascription -- so long as there is no fact that would be recognized within this framework as a defeater for the ascription. From this it follows that we can all be mistaken about whether a person desires that P, but there are no esoteric or deeply hidden facts that bear on the question.

The idea that we might be mistaken about whether someone has a given mental state leads to a natural question about self-knowledge: how much error does the ascription theory permit us regarding our own attitudes? We should be capable of making errors (e.g., about our biases), but we should be non-mysteriously expert at making judgments about our own attitudes. Mölder steers a course aimed to permit the interpretivist to hold this middle ground. According to the ascription theory, first-person ascriptions should be given default authority, even if these ascriptions do not stem from careful self-observation and inference (263f). One could simply hold this position on the ground that folk practices of attitude ascription permit it, but Mölder thinks it would then be "mysterious" why folk practices work in this way rather than some other (265). He proposes a line of thought that is surprising coming from an interpretivist: he turns to neuroscience. Without going into any detail, Mölder proposes that there are "subpersonal mechanisms" at work in us that make it true that our spontaneous self-ascriptions of attitudes have a high statistical reliability: our self-ascriptions, when produced by these sub-personal processes, tend to be self-ascriptions for which there are no defeaters and which are highly coherent with all the sources of evidence appropriate to attitude ascription (267-8). Accordingly, we make self-ascriptions in a way that we cannot make other-ascriptions, and so our self-ascriptions are correspondingly more authoritative. Mölder must hold that these subpersonal mechanisms do not have content, and are not themselves mental states, for if he grants these mechanisms contents then the interpretivism collapses. But Mölder thinks he can walk up to the brink without falling, and -- in the view of this representationalist and cognitive science aficionado -- he succeeds in achieving consistency in his commitments here.

Another point at which Mölder embraces neuroscience is in his discussion of consciousness. He wishes to hold that there is something to consciousness that does not depend upon something as socially constituted as ascribability, and this is the "what it is like" quality of consciousness. There are "certain subpersonal processes going on in one's brain and it is characteristic of these processes that there is something like having them." (247) So again subpersonal neural processes make an appearance.

Mölder is wary of asking these subpersonal processes to do too much theoretical work: every aspect of the mental that Mölder turns over to the merely neural is an aspect of the mental that the ascription theory cannot explain. Accordingly, Mölder does not hold that these subpersonal processes determining "what it is like" to be in perceptual states determine the contents of perceptual states. In the case of the conceptual contents of perceptual states (if these exist), there is no difficulty for the ascription theory. We ascribe apparent hearings of footsteps, seeings of green dresses, and similar mental states on the basis of sources of evidence that fit neatly with the ascription theory's requirements.

But non-conceptual contents (if these exist) would perhaps seem to the reader to present a more serious problem. How can we ascribe non-conceptual content to a person when we say that an apple looks red to her or when we say that a cat thinks there is cat food in its bowl? If there are non-conceptual contents, then our deployment of the concept of redness would seem to be too coarse to ascribe the right non-conceptual content to the woman looking at the apple, and our deployment of the concept of cat food would seem too sophisticated to ascribe the right non-conceptual content to the cat. Mölder has two substantive things to say that could address such concerns. For cases like that of seeing specific shades of red, Mölder holds that we might point to a swatch (or an apple) to ascribe the right mental state: the apple looks to be that shade to the woman (245-6). For cases like that of a cat having a belief about cat food, Mölder holds that when we ascribe that belief to the cat we are not yet ascribing the concept of cat food to the cat. To do so, we would have to be willing to ascribe beliefs about cat food to the cat in a manner conforming to Evans's famous Generality Constraint. We would have to be willing, in principle, to ascribe to the cat endlessly diverse beliefs about cats (this is cat food, this is a cat leash, this is a cat door … ), about food (this is fish food, this is human food … ), and so on. But we are not willing to ascribe these beliefs. Accordingly, our ascriptions of cat food beliefs to cats do not support the claim that we attribute the concept of cat food to the cat, not even when we say (and correctly say) that the cat believes there is cat food in its bowl (244-5).

The discussion of the ascription theory so far might make it seem that the theory ignores the more technical topics in the metaphysics of mind in favor of solving other problems facing interpretivism. This is far from the truth, however. Chapter seven is dedicated to a very un-Davidsonian theory of mental causation (Pettit and Jackson's idea of program explanation is brought to bear), and chapter 2 is an articulation of, and defense of, a very strict physicalism. The work of Kim features prominently in these sections, unsurprisingly, though Mölder engages with many other philosophers as well as he works through his preferred foundational metaphysics.

There are also extensive arguments against some of the general attacks on interpretivism (found in chapter 6). There are a number of points raised in defense of interpretivism in general (also chapter 6). There is a formal model of coherence articulated (chapter 5). There is an attack on a Davidsonian theory of meaning (chapter 3). Natural kind-theories of mental states are considered and attacked with some care (chapter 4). And there is yet more. The book is tremendously rich.

As I mentioned above, I think of myself as a representationalist in the philosophy of mind and a fan of cognitive science. So where do I hold Mölder to have gone wrong? Mölder has two important discussions of functionalism (57-70 and 131-150) where he criticizes this family of views, including my own preferred sub-family of views.

In the earlier discussion, he is focused on the metaphysics. Functionalism, he holds, is either committed to the existence of genuine properties (role properties) that cannot be accepted within Mölder's strict physicalism, or it is a view that reduces to very narrow type-identity: to token-identity, ultimately, and identity theory has its own problems. Here I think Mölder falls into a trap that has caught many metaphysically principled philosophers of mind: the trap of abandoning theories of mind for their metaphysical crimes when the same crimes are committed throughout biology and chemistry. Biological properties such as being an adaptation, being an environmental niche, or being a mitochondrion are multiply realizable properties just as much as mental properties are; and so too for chemical properties such as being in the native state conformation or being an exothermic reaction. If there are metaphysical crimes being committed in biology and chemistry then there has to be some way to reconstruct the metaphysics of biology and chemistry so that they turn out to be legitimate scientific enterprises, and this will not involve becoming an interpretivist about mitochondria or exothermic reactions. Whatever reconstruction is ultimately proposed for chemistry and biology, I propose the same reconstruction for psychology.

In the later discussion, Mölder is focused on issues closer to the philosophy of language than to metaphysics, and in particular he touches on the idea (dear to my heart and relevant to the preceding argument) that some mental kinds are natural kinds. Setting aside the metaphysical problems, Mölder holds that there are three properties that natural kinds must have but that mental kinds do not: objectivity, categoricity (there are no gradual transitions between natural kinds), and internality (natural kinds are not extrinsically characterized). He is right that mental kinds cannot be expected to show all of these properties, but then, biological kinds also cannot be expected to show all of these properties. Being a zebra and being a wing are objective but are not categorical (speciation is not categorical; natural selection often produces intermediate forms … ) and are not internal (connections to the past are important for many biological kinds; connections to the larger environment are important for many other kinds). So long as Darwinian biology is a respectable science (and it had better be!), there is still room for psychology to be one, and there is still room for mental kinds such as emotion, desire, and perception to prove to be natural kinds.

In Mind Ascribed, Mölder might not have convinced everyone, but he presents an exciting new form of interpretivism. He reminds those of us who have forgotten that the opponents of interpretivism cannot rest content with our attacks on Davidson and Dennett, and reminds those of us who have forgotten that the friends of interpretivism have a much larger space of attractive theoretical positions to take than they might have considered. The book is technically formidable in places and densely argued, and I would not teach it to undergraduates. But it deserves a place in graduate courses on interpretivism and a place on the shelf of every philosopher interested in either drawing on or attacking interpretivism in the philosophy of mind.