Mind, Brain, and Free Will

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Richard Swinburne, Mind, Brain, and Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2013, 242pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199662579.

Reviewed by David Palmer, University of Tennessee


This is an interesting and provocative book. It defends a view about human beings and their nature, which, for better or for worse, is a minority view nowadays among philosophers but which, as Swinburne points out, has probably been the "traditional majority Western view on these issues" (p. 3). This is the view that human persons have two distinct parts, a soul and a body (the soul, but not body, being their essential part); the soul, as a substance, can exercise causal power over the body; and it can do so free from deterministic causes in such a way as to render us morally responsible for what we do. The scope of the book is especially impressive, and the picture it paints is powerful and suggestive, even if, to this reader at least, it is not wholly persuasive. (To put my cards on the table, I lean towards physicalism about the mind and libertarianism about free will. If this sounds like an odd combination, it shouldn't. Libertarianism about free will just requires the falsity of causal determinism. It is an open question how libertarians should conceive of the "positive" power to freely will actions and, so, it is an open question whether this power can be possessed in a wholly physical world.)

The first two chapters outline Swinburne's more general metaphysical and epistemic commitments. Most important here is his contention that substances, properties, and events are basic constituents of the world (pp. 4-9) and his appeal to the principle of credulity, the principle that what seems to us to be the case probably is the case, absent any counter-evidence (pp. 42-44). With this as background, Swinburne turns to develop his views on the mind and free will. Chapters three to six focus on philosophy of mind. In them, Swinburne argues that mental events are not identical to physical events (chapter three), that the mental has genuine causal efficacy (chapter four), that all causation, properly speaking, is substance, rather than event, causation (chapter five), and that what makes someone the same person across time is the continued existence of a mental substance (chapter six). Chapters seven and eight focus on philosophy of action. Swinburne argues that human beings have free will in the sense that they, as mental substances, cause their actions without being causally determined to do so (chapter seven) and this capacity underwrites their moral responsibility (chapter eight).

Swinburne's mind-body dualism is anchored in his argument that mental properties are not identical to physical properties. First, he defines a mental property as "one to whose instantiation in it a substance necessarily has privileged access on all occasions of its instantiation" (p. 67), and a physical property as "one to whose instantiation in it a substance necessarily has no privileged access on any occasion of its instantiation" (pp. 67-68, emphasis added). Swinburne then introduces the notion of an informative designator -- a designator such that "anyone who knows what the word means (that is, has the linguistic knowledge of how to use it) knows a certain set of conditions necessary and sufficient (in any possible world) for a thing to be that thing (whether or not he can state those conditions in words)" (p. 12) -- and offers a condition for property difference -- "two properties are different iff their informative designators are not logically equivalent" (p. 68). Finally, he draws on this material to argue:

Since the informative designators of any physical properties are not logically equivalent to those of any mental properties (since there are different criteria for applying the designators), no mental property is identical to a physical property. The criteria for being in pain are not the same as the criteria for having some brain property (e.g. 'having one's c-fibres fire'), or behaving in a certain way in response to a bodily stimulus (e.g. crying out when a needle is stuck into you). The criteria for being in pain are how the subject feels, and the criteria for brain and behavioural events are what anyone could perceive. (pp. 69-70)

I doubt that physicalists will be persuaded to give up their position by this argument. Following the sort of physicalist view that I find attractive, what Swinburne's public/private contrast reveals is that, for some of our physical properties (e.g., the property of being in pain), we can think about those properties in more than one way. For example, we can think about the property of being in pain as something first-personal (a distinct feeling), or we can think of it as something third-personal (a state of the brain). But of course, the fact that we can think about something in two different ways does not entail that there are actually two different things to be thought about. As David Papineau (2002), a well-known defender of this sort view, suggests:

The key is to recognize that, even if conscious states are material states at the ontological level, we have two different ways of thinking about these states at the conceptual level. As well as thinking of them as material states, we can also think of them as feelings. . . . (p. 4)

On this view, then, Swinburne's purported definitions of mental and physical properties are best thought of, not as designators of different properties, but as indications that, for some of our physical properties, we can think about those properties in two different ways. Swinburne responds to this physicalist position by arguing that it fails because "the 'two concept' account collapses into another two property account" (p. 97). I found this rebuttal too brief and, so, difficult to assess. More attention to the nuances of this sort of physicalist position, as well as developing a more detailed response to it, would, I think, strengthen Swinburne's dualist argument.

Turning to Swinburne's account of free will, his is a libertarian view (that is, a view affirming free will but requiring the falsity of causal determinism). More specifically, it is an agent-causal libertarian view, according to which people's freedom consists in their causing their actions as (mental) substances without being causally determined to do so, where causation by a substance is not reducible to, nor composed of, causation by prior events or states. Competitor libertarian views are event-causal views, on which free actions are non-deterministically caused by prior events or states of the agent, such as her beliefs and desires (Kane 1996), and non-causal views, according to which free actions are not caused at all, not by prior events or states or by the agent as a substance (Ginet 2007).

I find the agent-causal view the least plausible of these three possible libertarian views, but I am open to being persuaded otherwise. Unfortunately, I was not persuaded otherwise by Swinburne's defense. His positive argument for the agent-causal position rests, largely, on his appeal to the principle of credulity: that when we are acting freely, it seems to us that we "bring about" our actions by "exercising [our] causal influence" as agents; and it does not seem to us that we bring them about by virtue of being the subject of certain events or states (p. 134, see also pp. 201-202). I am not sure how heavily this sort of introspective evidence should weigh in preferring one libertarian view over another, but even if we concede that it should weigh heavily, I doubt that Swinburne's evidence is decisive. For what it is worth, when I reflect on what it is like for me to act freely (when I believe that I am doing so), I do not have the strong impression of exercising any causal influence at all over my actions. Instead, it just seems to me that I act, unencumbered by any causal influence. This impression, if it favors anything, seems to favor the non-causal view rather than Swinburne's agent-causal account.

As part of his defense, Swinburne responds to two objections to agent-causal libertarian views, one by Derk Pereboom (2001) and the other by Peter van Inwagen (2000). Swinburne glosses Pereboom's objection as follows:

if what happens in the brain is subject to quantum theory . . . then if an event of a certain kind has a natural probability of occurring of p (e.g. 1/10), then in the long run, he concludes, 'it is overwhelmingly likely' that events of that kind will occur approximately a proportion p (e.g. 1/10) of the time. But, he argues, 'the agent-causal libertarian's proposal that the frequencies of agent-caused free choices dovetail with determinate physical probabilities involves coincidences so wild as to make it incredible'. (p. 205)

The objection, then, is that if physical events (say, raising my arm) are subject to probabilistic laws and so have a certain probability of occurring at a time (say, ten percent of the time in circumstances C), then the possibility of the person's agent-causing that event must likewise conform to the probability of that event occurring. But what could explain this power's so conforming? It seems to be a "wild coincidence" that it would.

Swinburne replies by first arguing that free will manifests itself most significantly in cases in which there is a conflict between our desire to behave in a certain way and our judgment that it would be best to act in a different way. He then argues that:

it is true that if the whole brain were in exactly the same state in relevant respects at various times, then it is 'overwhelmingly likely' that there would be no difference in the long run, between the actual frequencies of choices and the frequencies that would occur if the choices of agents were not free at all. But the view that the agent sometimes intervenes in the brain can explain why this happens. It is because the stronger is an inclination to do some action, the more effort it requires to resist it; and the agent only has a reason to resist it where that agent has a contrary moral belief. Although, as such, this does not entail that the strength of an inclination can be given a precise numerical value, it is to be expected that 'in the long run' agents will do what requires less effort. No 'wild' coincidences are involved (pp. 205-206).

On the face of it, this response seems to me to miss the mark. What Swinburne seems to be offering is an explanation of why, in cases in which we are torn between two actions (one that we desire to do and one which we think is best), agents will frequently "give in" to their desires and, so, there will, in the long term, be a relatively low probability that agents will act as they judge best. The explanation for this, according to Swinburne, is that it takes effort to resist temptation and, so, frequently such effort will fail.

But this is beside the point. What Pereboom wants is not an explanation of why it is that, when people are in torn situations, they usually act as they desire and, so, acting as they judge best has a low probability of occurring (which is what Swinburne seems to be trying to explain). Instead, given that acting as they judge best has the low probability of occurring that it does, what Pereboom wants is an explanation of why the probability of the person's agent-causing that action would match up to the very probability of that action's occurring (a probability determined by the relevant probabilistic law). The fact that it would match up in this way, Pereboom thinks, would be a wild coincidence.

The second objection, from van Inwagen, is that agent-caused actions are matters of chance because they lack a deterministic cause. Swinburne summarizes it as follows, including a quote from van Inwagen himself:

Suppose that at time t1 Alice has a choice of lying or telling the truth; and she tells the truth, and that her choice was not predetermined [but agent-caused]. Then,

Suppose that God a thousand times caused the universe to revert back to exactly the state it was at t1 . . . what would have happened? . . . Let us imagine the simplest case: we observe that Alice tells the truth in about half the replays and lies in about half the replays. If, after one hundred replays, Alice has told the truth fifty-three times and has lied forty-eight times . . . is it not true that we shall become convinced that what will happen in the next replay [and so in the actual world as well] is a matter of chance?" (p. 206).

In reply, Swinburne argues:

in the case of a person making choices . . . the person is responding to the influence of reason against stronger desires, and . . . we don't know that that process is characterized by a measureable bias; and so  . . . we have no reason to suppose that on each occasion of choice Alice has any fixed bias in favor of one outcome. But if there is no fixed bias, no natural probability on any particular occasion that Alice will tell the truth, the claim that there is a certain 'chance' with a precise value that she will has no meaning (p. 208).

Swinburne seems to be claiming that there is an incoherence in van Inwagen's thought experiment that threatens his claim that Alice's agent-caused action is a matter of chance. His worry seems to be that van Inwagen has not put himself in a position to legitimately claim that the probabilities of Alice acting as she does in each iteration of the roll back are as van Inwagen says that they are.

Be that as it may, let me rephrase van Inwagen's objection slightly, focusing on the contrastive fact of Alice's telling the truth rather than lying. Given that Alice's agent-caused action lacks a deterministic cause, there will be a nearby possible world with the same laws of nature and with the same past up to the moment of action in which Alice (or her counterpart) exercises her agent-causal activity differently -- she lies rather than telling the truth. But since the laws of nature and the past up to the time of the action are the same in both worlds, then, as Alfred Mele (1998) puts it (in connection with a different libertarian view), "there is nothing about the agent's powers, capacities, states of mind, moral character, and the like that explains this difference in [agent-causal] outcome" (p. 583). And if there is nothing that explains this difference in agent-causal activity, then it seems that Alice's telling the truth rather than lying is just a matter of (good) luck on her part, and so her action, even though it was agent-caused, cannot be a freely-willed action.

So far as I can tell, there is nothing in Swinburne's book that addresses this concern. Of course, agent-causal libertarians might have a good line of reply to this sort of objection. But they will not find any guidance in Swinburne's book.


Ginet, Carl. 2007. "An action can be both uncaused and up to the agent." In Intentionality, Deliberation, and Autonomy, eds. Christoph Lumer and Sandro Nannini. Aldershot, UK: Ashgate.

Kane, Robert. 1996. The Significance of Free Will. New York: Oxford University Press.

Mele, Alfred. 1998. "Review of Kane, The Significance of Free Will." Journal of Philosophy 95: 581-584.

Papineau, David. 2002. Thinking About Consciousness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Pereboom, Derk. 2001. Living Without Free Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Van Inwagen, Peter. 2000. "Free will remains a mystery." Philosophical Perspectives 14: 1-19.