Mind in Life: Biology, Phenomenology, and the Sciences of Mind

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Evan Thompson, Mind in Life: Biology, Phenomenology, and the Sciences of Mind, Harvard University Press, 2007, 543pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674025110.

Reviewed by Charles Siewert, University of California, Riverside


In Mind in Life Evan Thompson aims to assemble a framework for cognitive science that will begin to harmonize biology and phenomenology so as to help close the notorious "explanatory gap" between consciousness and nature. Thompson does not claim to close this gap completely, but to "enrich the philosophical and scientific resources we have for addressing" it (p. x). It may not yet be easy to tell how much headway has been made on the problem of the gap. But we should acknowledge what Thompson has clearly achieved: a remarkable and complex synthesis, in which phenomenology as he understands it is joined with what he calls "embodied dynamicism" in a manner that helps define an important emerging vision of the place of consciousness in nature.

The sources on which Thompson draws are primarily: certain aspects of Husserl's and Merleau-Ponty's philosophies; ideas in theoretical biology on self-organization; and dynamic systems theory as applied to the brain. This superficially disparate collection is unified in a way that can provide a valuable introduction for the uninitiated, and the possibilities Thompson opens up will undoubtedly be welcomed by many who are dissatisfied with current orthodoxies in cognitive science.

Thompson labels his general view of cognition "the enactive approach." As developed here it extends and revises the position he originally proposed, together with Eleanor Rosch and Francisco Varela, in The Embodied Mind (MIT, 1991). At its core lies a commitment to "embodied dynamicism," a relatively recent perspective in cognitive science that he contrasts with both connectionism and earlier cognitivist theories. The "cognitive revolution" has (since its ascendancy in the 1960s and 70s) freed psychology from behaviorism, by interposing mental processes between stimulus and response. But, Thompson says, in treating these processes as computations implemented in a "skull-bound" symbol system, cognitivism sustains the behaviorist repudiation of consciousness, since it places the mind's work in "subpersonal routines" inaccessible to the personal level of consciousness. The connectionist views that achieved prominence in the 1980s did, as Thompson sees it, offer in some respects a significantly new approach, since the "distributed subsymbolic representations" that emerge from the activity of connectionist networks do not count as "symbols in the traditional computational sense" (p. 9). And this is progress, he thinks, insofar as it paves the way for a "more dynamic conception of the relation between cognitive processes and the environment" and promises to bring the theoretical image of mental processes closer to neural reality. However, Thompson finds connectionism disappointing as well, since it retains the dubious cognitivist tendency to project onto the brain computational tasks that truly exist only in the eye of an outside observer, and it persists in estranging mind from subjectivity, while failing to situate mind in the world via sensorimotor activity.

Thus an alternative is needed: the enactive approach. According to its "embodied dynamicism," the brain is a self-organizing system tracing "trajectories" in a "space" of states, in response to "perturbations" from the outside -- trajectories characterized by a set of differential equations. (This is the dynamicism.) And what makes brains the self-organizing systems they are is their linkage of organisms' sensory surfaces with effectors so as to produce and maintain a "sensorimotor agent." (This is where the "embodied" part comes in.) Thompson argues that this view, unlike its competitors, can see natural cognition in terms of the "meanings that stimuli have for the animal" situated in its environment, rather than in terms of the meanings imposed by an observer, since meaning for the organism emerges from its dynamically self-organizing sensorimotor activity (p. 53). And by elaborating a biologically based conception of cognition that gives a natural place to the significance things have for an organism, the enactivist hopes to join biology to subjectivity and phenomenology, where other theories have left a yawning explanatory gap.

What is this problematic gap? On an influential picture,

[t]he problem is that physical accounts explain the structure and function of a system as characterized from the outside, but a conscious state is defined by its subjective character as experienced from the inside. Given this difference, physical accounts of structure and function seem insufficient to explain consciousness. (pp. 222-23)

Thompson is not satisfied with this now more or less standard way of thinking about the alleged gap. But he does recognize there are deeply challenging questions about why things should be experienced by us in this or that way -- or any way at all -- when our brains are active. And he does not want to deny that philosophy should play a significant role in understanding and addressing this challenge. On the contrary, he thinks we need philosophy to help us reconceive both "sides" of the gap in a way that will facilitate progress. On the "physical side," we need to enrich our conception of biology with the notions of "self-organization" or "autopoiesis," understood in terms of dynamic systems theory (utilizing ideas pioneered by Maturana, Varela, Freeman, and others). And we need to reconceive the "consciousness side," by means of phenomenology (building on Husserl and Merleau-Ponty). Crudely put, the promise is this: if we think of the brain as a self-organizing, embodied dynamic system, and if we develop -- through phenomenology -- conceptions of sense experience and motor activity, of imagery, of the temporality of experience, of emotion, and of empathy, then we will be able to find an explanatorily satisfying harmony in our conceptions of both sides of the gap -- that is, in our conceptions both of the ways in which things appear to us and of the ways in which our brains are active -- and thereby glimpse the day when the gap will disappear.

In getting a bit fuller idea of Thompson's quest for this gap-closing harmony, it is possible here to consider only a small portion of the wide-ranging issues that arise in its course. But clearly his notion of an "autopoietic system" plays a particularly crucial role -- and so is perhaps a good place to start. Roughly, a system is autopoietic or self-organizing just in case it has a "semipermeable boundary" within which reactions take place that produce the boundary and that "regenerate the components of the system," partly due to the existence of the boundary (p. 101). In virtue of possessing this sort of self-maintenance, bacteria and amoebas count as living things, whereas crystals and viruses do not. Thompson goes on to conclude that if a living system's self-organization includes enough "adaptivity" and "flexibility" in response to change in its environment, that will be enough to give it more than merely "minimal autopoiesis": it will also manifest norm-guided behavior, hence cognition, in a broad sense (p. 149). Since, when an organism is self-organizing in this normatively assessable way, things have significance or valence for it, this is supposed to prepare us to grasp how biological activity involves a kind of "inwardness" or "interiority" that is at least a "precursor" to the "interiority of consciousness." Thus on Thompson's view the challenge of explaining consciousness physically or naturalistically needs to be viewed as the challenge of how to explain it biologically. And that challenge is to be met by specifying what particular kind of normatively assessable self-organization "constitutes a phenomenal world."

Thompson recognizes that some (like David Chalmers) are likely to object to this gap-closing strategy, on the grounds that any attempt to say what special form of self-organization constitutes consciousness will run up against a "zombie" problem. The problem would be this. Consider whichever specific kind of autopoiesis allegedly constitutes (and is no mere precursor of ) consciousness itself. That form of self-organization is perhaps actually found in (and only in) conscious beings. But given the conception we have of our own consciousness "from the inside," then, provided we don't just stipulatively inject our first-person notions of experience or appearance into our account of the relevant form of self-organization, that self-organization will appear to us at least conceivably present in beings ("zombies") lacking any consciousness at all. So there will still be some logical or conceptual gap between something's having whatever more specific form of self-organization you would like to use to explain consciousness, and its having genuine consciousness. And if that's so, then we will still be left wondering what entitles us to say that some such form of self-organization is not just contingently nomically related to consciousness, but (as Thompson wishes to say) that it constitutes consciousness.

Thompson responds here by doubting whether, when we really think it through, zombies in the relevant sense are conceivable. Thus we have a "phenomenological critique of zombies" (pp. 230-34). And here we can see one way in which Thompson's Husserlian phenomenology is supposed to help with the overall project. (Incidentally, to understand how Thompson makes Husserl a friend of embodied dynamicism, it is helpful to bear in mind that he recants the former cognitivist, Dreyfus-inspired interpretation of Husserl endorsed in The Embodied Mind, and he now (like Dan Zahavi) reads Husserl as much closer to Merleau-Ponty.) The "critique" then, goes as follows: Thompson suggests that if we consider the "phenomenology of bodily experience" and its relation to perceptual continuity from a Husserlian perspective, we will say that the "continuity of the object through a changing manifold of appearances" constitutively depends on a "linkage" with the experience of one's own bodily posture and movement. Thus a form of bodily self-experience is a "constitutive condition of ordinary perception" (p. 232). But if we accept that, then (Thompson argues) we can ultimately make no sense of the idea of a completely unconscious being (a "zombie") "whose (functionally defined) perceptual abilities are exactly those of its (physically identical) conscious counterpart" (p. 233). No putative "zombie" could conceivably be just like us in perceptual abilities, without having kinesthetic experience. But a zombie with bodily self-experience is no zombie at all.

Thompson suggests an ingenious strategy here, but one may register a doubt. Suppose we grant Thompson his Husserlian premises. That is, we accept that conscious beings such as ourselves and (presumably) numerous other animals have perceptual abilities -- specifically, capacities to experience spatial constancies through a flux in appearances -- that cannot be separated from forms of bodily self-experience. But does this render the notion of zombies incoherent? That's not clear. Even granting the Husserlian view of perception, we may still think we have objective conceptions of space and motion that permit us to conceive of beings that move about in their surroundings, in response to physical stimulation, as we conscious beings do, though neither their surroundings nor their own bodies sensorily appear to them (e.g., look or feel to them) any way at all -- thus they have no "phenomenal world." And it is the apparent conceivability of this which underlies the zombie-haunted conception of the gap that Thompson wants to dispel. It would seem that, to complete his case, Thompson would need to argue that relevant capacities for constancy-constituting movement, whose exercise we experience, cannot even be conceptualized (and thus imputed to our putative zombie counterparts) in complete abstraction from our experience of them -- that is, these specific capacities for movement cannot be understood by us except insofar as their manifestation is "lived."

However this may be, having left behind the specter of zombies, and with his enlarged notion of autopoiesis in hand, Thompson finds the conception of the explanatory gap transformed in a crucial way. For now: "the guiding issue is to understand the emergence of living subjectivity from living being, where living being is understood as already possessed of an interiority that escapes the objectivist picture of nature" (p. 236). We can get an idea of how Thompson thinks we need to proceed at this juncture if we look at his (Chapter 9) discussion of the work of Alva Noë and others that purports to bridge explanatory gaps. Thompson argues that these theorists' efforts still fall short by failing to include an understanding of the kind of autonomous selfhood that characterizes certain sensorimotor systems (as distinct from, say, guided missiles), and that they still need to account for "subjectivity in the sense of prereflective bodily self-awareness," which Thompson says involves a kind of "non-object-directed" self-awareness in which one's feelings are experienced "as mine." However, Thompson concedes that more needs to be done to clarify the relevant notion of bodily self-consciousness and its relation to the "dynamic sensorimotor approach" to finish the job of accounting for consciousness.

Further indication of how Thompson envisages gap-closing explanation coming from a combination of phenomenology and dynamic systems theories can be found in his extended (Chapter 11) discussion of Varela's "neurophenomenological" account of the temporality of experience, considered in terms of a Husserlian "retention/protention structure." On this (not readily summarized) view, the structure of time-consciousness has a kind of "analogue in the dynamic structure of neural processes" (p. 356). Thompson does not suppose that this structural correspondence allows us to "reduce" the temporal structure of experience, phenomenologically considered, to patterns of synchronies in brain activity. And so he recognizes that a question remains about whether we have here only a kind of "structural isomorphism" instead of genuine explanatory relation. While Thompson holds out the promise that his approach will yield the latter (p. 358), he does not argue for this in detail.

As Thompson does not purport to have finally closed the sort of explanatory gaps he recognizes, but only to have pointed the way to making progress, it would perhaps not be fair to complain that he does not tell us more about just how we can appropriately enrich sensorimotor accounts of perception such as Noë's with an understanding of bodily self-awareness, or about how we should conceive of the correspondence between phenomenologically described structures and the dynamics of brain activity, in order to see this correspondence as (non-reductively) explanatory. And, though the grand effort to close the gap provides the overarching theme of Thompson's book, one might be doing it an injustice if one focused narrowly on how near it brings us to final closure, since this would risk slighting his detailed discussions of a number of topics interesting in their own right: life and autopoiesis/self-organization; evolution and development; emergent processes; the phenomenology of imagery, time consciousness, emotion, and empathy -- topics which (unfortunately, for reasons of space) can merely be mentioned here. However one assesses Thompson's degree of progress on gap-closure, engagement with these discussions could do much to enrich one's understanding. And he furthers the case that a searchingly phenomenological treatment of certain topics (though often neglected in cognitive science) is both possible and necessary.

Still, it seems that there are certain key issues here that need much more probing and detailed argument before the promise of Thompson's approach is to be fully evident. One wants to hear more about Thompson's crucial (Kant and Merleau-Ponty inspired) idea that a kind of normativity and significance emerges, once a system's self-maintaining behavior becomes flexible and adaptive enough to environmental changes. And more does need to be said about the nature of "pre-reflective bodily self-consciousness" to see why it should be added to the sensorimotor approach in order to give a gap closing account of sentience. For one thing, it remains unclear why my experience of my own body should be thought to include an experience of my own feelings "as mine" -- and what this latter inclusion means, and how it figures in subjectivity generally. Thompson indicates that it does not mean that my own feelings are for me "an object" somehow given to me under the aspect "mine." Rather this "experienced as mine" talk should be interpreted as imputing a "non-object-directed" form of intentionality. But this invites further questions about how we are to understand the contrast between the two forms of intentionality alleged -- what is the difference between (as he puts it on p. 23) being "directed to an object," and being merely "open to what is other"? And how is one to understand the application of this latter category to one's own experience? Though Thompson's appropriations of Husserl and Merleau-Ponty are often quite valuable in rendering important aspects of their views accessible (the interpretation of the latter's Structure of Behavior in Chapter 4 is particularly helpful), they will raise many issues, both interpretive and directly philosophical, that will take us beyond what he can provide within the limitations of this book.

However, these concerns should not cause us to lose sight of Thompson's achievement in unifying, shaping, and advancing an intriguing research program, exciting for its ambitious scope, for its creative synthesis of such a variety of sources, and for its inspiring determination to do justice to both phenomenological and naturalistic perspectives. Thompson's treatments of each of the many fascinating topics he discusses leave open many questions. But he is to be applauded for pulling so much difficult and diverse material into a coherent and accessible unity. His book should be read by all those interested in exploring new approaches in cognitive science, and in finding ways to integrate a personal level, reflective understanding of our experiential lives with perspectives in brain science, while refusing to disfigure the former in procrustean theories.