Mind, Meaning, and Knowledge: Themes from the Philosophy of Crispin Wright

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Annalisa Coliva (ed.), Mind, Meaning, and Knowledge: Themes from the Philosophy of Crispin Wright, Oxford University Press, 2012, 504pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199278053.

Reviewed by Aidan McGlynn, The University of Edinburgh


Crispin Wright is one of the most important and influential philosophers working today, and this is the first of two volumes to be published by OUP in his honour. The volume features an introduction by the editor, a brief biography of Wright, a complete bibliography of his work, thirteen papers by distinguished philosophers divided into four topics, and four substantial reply pieces by Wright, one covering each topic. In what follows I'll offer an overview of the papers, interspersed rather unsystematically with key points from Wright's replies as well as some of my own observations, followed by some comments on the volume as a whole.

Rule Following and the Normativity of Meaning

Paul Boghossian argues that Kripkenstein misses the real problem raised by Wittgenstein's discussion of rules; the ultimate casualty is not the factuality of meaning, but rather whether it's even so much as possible to follow a rule. The import of this shift in focus is twofold. First, Boghossian argues that Wright's Intention View, according to which following a particular rule involves having an intention with that rule as its content, looks hopeless as a response to Wittgenstein's challenge, properly understood. Following a rule can't involve having an intention with the rule as its content (whether at the personal or sub-personal level) because then rule-following essentially involves inference, which is itself a matter of rule-following. Second, whether or not Kripkenstein's meaning scepticism is a stable resting place, the real sceptical import of the rule-following considerations, that reasoning never involves following a general rule, seems utterly intolerable. The upshot is that we're faced with a genuine paradox.

Christopher Peacocke offers a response to Kripkenstein's challenge, appealing to the idea that following a rule paradigmatically involves 'understanding-based application of a concept' (51). Peacocke's positive proposal is that grasping a concept consists in having tacit knowledge of the fundamental reference rule for that concept, and the rule for a given concept figures in the explanation of the 'norms or reasons distinctive of that concept' (53). So one's tacit knowledge puts one in a position to appreciate the reasons available for judging certain contents containing the concept in question. That's how understanding based concept-application can be responsive to reasons, and that's how we can appreciate the requirements a rule makes in a given case even though those requirements are not constitutively dependent on our reactions and linguistic activities. Peacocke goes on to offer an account of conscious knowledge of what one means, and to try to forestall the objection that the kind of subpersonal computations involved in judging in a way that is reasonable in light of one's tacit knowledge of fundamental rules of reference are themselves susceptible to a sceptical challenge (a worry which Wright returns to in his reply).

Paul Horwich defends a certain conception of implicit rule-following, where the would-be follower is not guided by any representation of the rule, and typically won't be able to produce a correct formulation of the rule (or perhaps even recognise a correct formulation when presented with one). For example, one might take our ability to produce and recognise strings that accord with the grammar of English to involve implicit rule-following in this sense. Horwich suggests that most of the philosophical interest in rule-following really concerns the implicit variety (79). That seems dubious. Wittgenstein's own principal example is the rule 'add 2', while Kripke's is the plus function, given its usual recursive definition, and these seem light years away from the case of grammatical rules. There are of course issues about how these rules connect with our arithmetical practices, justifying us in returning particular responses rather than others. But that's just the point; the issues raised by Wittgenstein and Kripke don't seem to be especially driven by implicitness in Horwich's sense. In any case, there clearly is an important issue concerning how implicit rule following is possible. Horwich proposes that it's enough for a certain pattern of activity to count as a case of implicitly following a rule R that R is an ideal law governing that activity, and the subject has a tendency to correct herself when she behaves contrary to R. By an 'ideal law', Horwich seems to have in mind something close to what Timothy Williamson (2000) has recently labeled a constitutive rule, though of course this comparison is only illuminating insofar as we have a grip on the latter.

Akeel Bilgrami argues that the possibility of one's meaning intentions failing to be fulfilled, and so space for meaning to be normative, isn't revealed in cases in which one misapplies a word. To think otherwise is to confuse the intentions involved in speaker meaning with the intentions involved in sentence meaning. That seems right, though one might think that this possibility is revealed in cases like Burge's 'arthritis' abuser. Bilgrami tries to head off this appeal to content externalism by arguing that externalism conflicts with the transparency of Fregean sense, which is needed if we are to have a robust distinction between ignorance and irrationality. Rather than take this to suggest that meaning isn't as intimately connected to intentions as we might have thought, Bilgrami concludes that meaning intentions force a qualification to Wittgenstein's insight that intentions are inherently normative, and so are 'degenerate'. The crucial claim here is that if we're to avoid mistaking ignorance for irrationality, we need a response to Frege puzzle cases that prevents them from arising 'one level up' (105), at the level of senses themselves rather than planets, orators, cities, or pianists. The point isn't very well spelled out, though, and there's no engagement with challenges to transparency from Williamson and others, nor with recent work by John Campbell, Mark Sainsbury and others which precisely attempts to show how to keep ignorance and irrationality apart while giving up transparency.[1]

Like Boghossian, Wright now sees the real challenge raised by the rule-following considerations as that of explaining how rule-following is so much as possible, given that the only workable model of how a rule with general content might guide one in a particular case seems to involve inference, which threatens to invite regress. Wright suggests that we can view Peacocke and Horwich as exploring two salient directions of response; retreating to the subpersonal level, where we might hope to escape the regress, and jettisoning the idea that the rationality of our beliefs is a matter of their being formed in light of the requirements of rules with general content. Wright isn't sanguine about the prospects of either, since he's sceptical that the former really helps escape the regress, and he thinks that the latter has an unacceptable casualty in the ethics of belief. Boghossian's proposal, that we take seriously the idea that rule-following doesn't always involve inference, is 'too difficult', and so Wright is left with the suggestion that inference doesn't always require rule-following (386). But this isn't really developed, nor does Wright say much to silence Boghossian's worries with it. Interest in rule-following seems to have been waning of late, and the papers here should contribute to restoring confidence in the topic's interest, importance, and difficulty.

Knowledge of Our Own Minds and Meanings

Barry Smith discusses the following puzzle: we typically immediately and authoritatively know the meanings of our words, but those meanings need to be answerable to publicly observable facts if we're to successfully communicate with each other and avoid Wittgenstein's worries with the idea of a private language. Smith's positive suggestion is that we should resist the pressure to 'exteriorize' meaning, and instead 'claim that the speaker's first-person perspective is basic' (153). The publicity of meaning, such as it is, is due to one possessing an entitlement in Wright's sense -- a non-evidential warrant -- for taking it that anyone who uses an expression in one's idiolect means the same by it. Smith's paper is rather long, and I'd have preferred to see him use that space to develop this proposal more fully rather than to lay out the debate in such great detail -- the discussion is really interesting, but as Wright notes, Smith's employment of entitlement is 'somewhat briskly done' (415), which feels like a bit of a let down given that it's a 35-page paper. Wright also worries that entitlement isn't fit for purpose, and that the puzzle Smith tries to neutralise isn't well motivated, as it's not clear what the semantic self-knowledge supposedly jeopardised by the 'exteriorization' of meaning is supposed to be.

Dorit Bar-On defends the neo-expressivism explanation of the security of avowals that she developed in detail in her 2004 book, and considers to what extent it provides a workable model for expressivism about other subject matters once it is decoupled from an anti-realist agenda.[2] In particular, she suggests that ethical discourse might be ripe for a neo-expressivist treatment, once we concentrate on issues about moral motivation rather than worries about the metaphysical status of moral properties. In his reply, Wright offers two principal objections to expressivist treatments of avowals. First, he objects to the idea that an expressivist treatment of the distinctive features of avowals will completely lay to rest the idea that we have privileged epistemic access to our own mental states, arguing that this will commit one to the absurdity that others might be better placed to tell which (say) phenomenal state one is presently in. And second, he notes that sometimes avowals are purposive acts, quite unlike the kinds of involuntary expressions of pain that Wittgenstein likened them to in his proto-expressivist remarks in the Investigations. When this is so, Wright argues, an avowal won't be deemed authoritative in virtue of directly expressing the mental state avowed, but rather in virtue of the presumption that one has privileged access to the presence and character of that mental state.

There's room to wonder how cleanly these objections engage Bar-On's actual position. She has explicitly denied that her goal is to explain away our apparent special access to our own mental lives, instead suggesting that expressivism is needed because whatever this special access comes to, it won't suffice to account for the authority of avowals. As for the second point, while it's true that Bar-On's essay doesn't speak to this issue, in Bar-On 2004 there is a long discussion of how to generalise expressivism beyond what she calls 'avowals proper', which she takes to work more or less on the model provided by simple expressive behaviour (2004: 242-3), to avowals in general. Wright's objection might suggest that no such story can be told, but I'm inclined to suspect that we'll need to look at the details of Bar-On's attempt before we can draw that conclusion.

Truth, Objectivity, and Relativism

Blackburn argues that there's an instability in leading deflationary accounts of truth, since they turn out to presuppose inflationary accounts of other key semantically significant notions such as propositions or Field's 'sentences as understood'. Blackburn takes this to show that appeals to deflationism in defending expressivism about the normative aren't in good standing, but he suggests that the compromises of deflationism that expressivism leads to are ones which the expressivist can readily live with. He also considers how distant the position he ends up with is from the one defended in Wright 1992 (an issue which Wright takes up in more detail in his reply).

Stewart Shapiro examines two of Wright 1992's cruces of objectivity, width of cosmological role and cognitive command. An area of discourse -- mathematics, morals, the comic, and so on -- has width of cosmological role just in case the truths in which it traffics explain contingencies not belonging to that discourse. Shapiro's main worry with this is that explanation is an interest relative notion, and it's hard to square this feature with the idea that there's such a tie between explanation and objectivity. Wright suggests that the interest-relativity of explanation can simply be written into the condition for width of cosmological role, but he takes Shapiro to be on to a more troubling point, namely that employing width of cosmological role as a crux of objectivity seems to require adopting a rather realist picture of explanatory relationships. Shapiro's challenge to cognitive command involves two scientists who reach opposed conclusions despite investigating in what we're inclined to say are equally conscientious ways, due to their respective theory-laden takes on what the data are. Cognitive command demands that it be a priori that one of the scientists is guilty of some kind of cognitive shortcoming, yet 'each has followed the proper methodology flawlessly' (229). However, this kind of failure of cognitive command doesn't seem to impugn science's claim to objectivity. Wright notes that our best scientific methods may themselves be 'prone to cognitive shortfall' (430), suggesting that cognitive command may still hold in such cases. The real issue Shapiro's discussion raises, according to Wright, is that questions about whether a discourse satisfies cognitive command will sometimes be trickier and less self-contained than one might like, requiring one to bring to bear independent considerations speaking for or against the objectivity of that discourse.

Carol Rovane argues that the distinctive metaphysical commitment of alethic relativism is that there are alternatives: truths that cannot be 'embraced together'. The key is to articulate the sense in which alternatives exclude each other without being logically incompatible. Rovanne's proposal is that alternatives are logically isolated from each other, neither being consistent nor inconsistent. Whether we ultimately accept it or reject it, relativism should be understood at multimundialism, according to which 'there are many incomplete bodies of truths that cannot be conjoined' (256). If a world is a totality of facts not things, then there are many worlds. This is radical stuff, and as Wright points out, it's not obvious that multimundialism provides any real relief from the problems that motivate relativism in the first place, in particular those involving cases of apparently faultless disagreement about basic matters of taste and the like. Rovane already holds that we cannot maintain that such cases involve genuine disagreement on pain of admitting counterexamples to the law of non-contradiction, but Wright's point is that multimundialism further commits us to holding that the parties are egregiously mistaken, insofar as they take themselves to be part of 'a single, mutually understood conversation, directed at a single dish and its merits' (444). So it's not clear that the radical metaphysics purchases any real progress in making sense of what's going on in these kinds of cases.

Wright's replies on this topic cover a lot of further ground, and in particular he focuses on the prospects of the various proposals to make sense of what he calls parity. That's the idea that the parties to a disagreement about (say) whether stewed rhubarb is delicious can themselves recognise the validity of the opposed viewpoint, even while remaining rational in hanging on to their own verdicts. Wright acknowledges that his own intuitionist account of apparently faultless disagreements doesn't by itself make room for parity, but he argues that relativism fares no better. Wright's new proposal is that we might be able to underwrite parity if we recognise that the disagreements in question characteristically arise within discourses that, by the lights of Wright 1992, traffic in genuinely truth-apt contents but which possess none of the marks of objectivity, and that the truth-predicate is stripped of its usual normative force in such contexts. On this construal, if you hold that stewed rhubarb is delicious and I contend that it is not, I am committed (contra relativism) to thinking of myself as judging truly and you as judging falsely. But Wright thinks we can avoid sliding from here to the idea that I'm committed to regarding you as guilty of any kind of 'cognitive fault' (448). I'll table one worry with this. To hold that discourse about taste is merely minimally truth apt involves, among other things, holding that truth is epistemically constrained within that discourse. This means that if I truly believe that stewed rhubarb isn't delicious, your opposed belief is not merely false, but runs contrary to something that's knowable or something for which warrant is available. Isn't that a kind of cognitive shortcoming?[3] The point is that it looks like it's not just alethic notions that need to be robbed of their normative force in order to underwrite parity; we'll need to do the same for appraisals in terms of whichever epistemic statuses constrain truth in the discourse in question. And one might wonder if the idea that such epistemic appraisals can be stripped of their normative force really makes sense.

Warrant, Transmission Failure, and Scepticism

Much of Wright's work in epistemology has concerned the proper characterisation of transmission of warrant failure, and its significance for various debates in epistemology and the philosophy of mind. In particular, Wright has contended that it's the principle of transmission, not the weaker principle of closure for warrant, that's the real causalty of Dreskte's famous zebra example. Transmission entails that having visual warrant to believe the equines at the zoo are zebras and recognising the entailment suffices for that visual warrant to transmit to the conclusion that they're not cleverly disguised mules. Closure only entails that under these conditions one must have some warrant or other for that conclusion, and Wright's idea was that it's the former commitment, not the latter, that's intolerable. Of course, valid inferences surely sometimes do transmit warrant to their conclusions; hence the interest in specifying the conditions under which transmission fails. A second task has been to consider the prospects of a transmission-failure diagnosis of what's wrong with Moore's proof of an external world (considered as an antidote to scepticism rather than idealism):

(I) Here is a hand.

(II) If there are hands then there is an external world.

(III) So, there is an external world.

Jim Pryor argues that there is only one viable model of transmission failure that can be extracted from Wright's writings on the topic, the background warrant model. According to this model, a recognisably valid argument will fail to transmit one's warrant for the premises just when one needs to have antecedent warrant for the conclusion in order to obtain that warrant for the premise. Pryor defends a version of what he calls 'dogmatism', which has it that some cases of perceptual warrant are immediate, not resting on any warrants to believe further propositions. One upshot of dogmatism is that Moore's proof doesn't fit the background warrant model, and so if Pryor is right that this is the only workable model, it follows that the argument in fact transmits warrant to its conclusion. Wright disavows the background warrant model, taking it to amount to the claim that only a '(suppressed) premise circular argument' can display transmission-failure (462). It isn't clear to me that this is what Pryor had in mind. Pryor explicitly allows for warrant for p to be 'constituted by' warrant for a distinct proposition q even though one's warrant for p is non-inferential (274). Wright may not like the 'constituted by' language here, but the claim does seem to suggest that when Pryor speaks of warrant for p requiring antecedent background warrant for a proposition q, he's not treating q as the implicit premise in an enthymematic inference for p.

José Zalabardo's essay is concerned with the same set of issues. He argues that the project of formulating a 'limitation clause' on the principle of transmission has proved pretty fruitless, but he suggests that Moore's proof fails to deliver warrant for its conclusion even if we endorse the following unqualified transmission principle:

T1: If p is a proposition that S believes and for which S has warrant (and q is a proposition for which S doesn't have warrant), then by recognising the validity of the inference from p to q, S will acquire warrant for q. (305)

Zalabardo combines this with a particular formulation of closure; if p entails q and S has warrant for this and for p, then S has warrant for q (312). Applying these to Moore's argument, S either lacks or possesses warrant for the premise (I). In the latter case, assuming that S has warrant for (II), then by closure S must also have warrant for the conclusion (III). In neither case is the antecedent of the above transmission principle satisfied, since it requires that S has warrant for (I) but not for (III). The remaining task for the 'anti-Moorean' is to vindicate the assumption that S has warrant for (II) prior to recognising the validity of that inference. Zalabardo's proposal is that that anyone who has the concepts featuring in the premise and conclusion of Moore's argument has warrant for the entailment, 'whether or not she has consciously entertained the entailment, let alone recognized its validity' (313). The main problem with Zalabardo's argument lies with his implausible formulation of closure. At a minimum, we'll either want to make the principle's antecedent more demanding, requiring that S has competently inferred q from p under certain favourable conditions, or we'll want to weaken its consequent, so that all that issues is that S is in a position to know q.[4] But neither of these revised principles sustains Zalabardo's argument.

As we've seen, Pryor contends that one's warrant for Moore's premise (I) is immediate, and so in particular doesn't rest on the conclusion (III) for any kind of support. In contrast, Wright holds that one's visual experiences as of a hand only warrant one in believing (I) if one has antecedent warrant for accepting (III). In her contribution, Annalisa Coliva argues that we can steer a middle course between these two treatments of the proof. Occupying the Goldilocks spot involves recognising that obtaining warrant for Moore's premise (I) demands that one positively, though perhaps implicitly (332), assumes that (III) is true. Open-mindedness about (III) isn't an option, rationally speaking, but crucially this doesn't entail that one needs warrant for (III). Coliva acknowledges that this proposal only has mileage in it if we are successful in the project of 'damage limitation' (Wright 2004: 206) that we must engage in once we have conceded that basic acceptances like (III) aren't warrantable, which she takes to involve vindicating the rationality of accepting such propositions. Her proposal is that assuming (III) without having warrant for it can be rational because accepting it is constitutive of being (epistemically) rational. Coliva's proposal is intriguing, but it's a little difficult to see how it can avoid exacerbating certain well-known objections to Wright's position that suggest that one's epistemic standing towards (I) can be no better than towards (III), and so that the project of 'damage limitation' fails. I should stress that Coliva does address such worries in other work, but they seem central to assessing her proposal, and so it's unfortunate that we're not here given any clues here as to how she might handle them.

Wright's claim that one requires antecedent warrant for (III) in order to rationally claim warrant for the quotidian proposition (I) looks like a massive concession to scepticism. Wright acknowledges that it is -- hence the need for 'damage limitation' -- since it follows that Moore's proof, our best shot at gaining warrant for (III), turns out to be subtly epistemically circular. However, the sceptic overlooks our possession of a non-evidential warrant -- an entitlement, in the terminology introduced above -- for (III), and so we can avoid the truly sceptical conclusion that we cannot rationally claim warrant for any propositions about the external world (Wright 2004). Michael Williams argues that this lets the sceptic 'get away' (352) with too much. He contends that the reason Wright has to engage in 'damage limitation' is that entitlements are merely pragmatic warrants (359), and Williams thinks the damage is worse than Wright appreciates. First, pragmatic warrants are contingent on subjects having certain aims and this is a contingent, empirical matter that is itself vulnerable to sceptical doubts. And second, it seems to introduce an unwelcome kind of epistemic relativity, since warrant for belief in the literal veracity of the Bible or the reliability of crystal ball gazing doesn't have to wait on evidence, but has ramifications for which propositions we can rationally claim to enjoy positive epistemic status. Finally, Williams takes Wright to task for buying into a scepticism-conducive epistemological framework, which Williams argues is foreign to our common-sense picture of these matters.

In Wright's replies, he clarifies the account of transmission failure he wants to operate with, his treatment of Moore's proof, and the sense in which he is primarily interested in issues about second-order warrants rather than their first-order counterparts, and he defends entitlement's claim to be regarded as properly epistemic and an essential component of a satisfactory response to scepticism.


In conclusion, this is a terrific volume, covering a huge range of central topics in epistemology, metaphysics, and the philosophies of mind and language. Together the essays offering a fitting tribute to Wright's contributions to these issues, as well as a testament (which I know Wright will find gratifying) to the continuing relevance of the later Wittgenstein to our attempts to come to grips with them. Two particular strengths are the editor's introduction and Wright's replies. Coliva does a truly outstanding job of briefly and clearly introducing the issues, Wright's own approaches to them, and how the present essays engage with each. As for Wright's replies, their format allows them to capture something of his present modus operandi, which involves collaborative engagement with a number of seemingly disparate topics, looking for unexpected points of overlap between them. The distinctiveness of this approach is often largely lost by the time its outputs make it into print, but interestingly that hasn't happened here. My one complaint with the volume is that several of the contributors seem to have recycled earlier work, rather than coming up with anything new. This issue is hardly particular to the present volume, of course, and in general editors and referees acting on behalf of presses should be doing more to ensure that contributors are offering genuinely new material to volumes that aren't anthologies of previously published work. That said, there's plenty of novel, deeply interesting and insightful philosophy on show here.


Bar-On, Dorit. 2004. Speaking My Mind: Expression and Self-Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Campbell, John. 1987. Is Sense Transparent? Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 88: 273-92.

Lockard, Matthew. Forthcoming. Closure Provides No Relief from the Problem of Easy Knowledge. Erkenntnis.

Sainsbury, R. M. 1997. Fregean Sense. Reprinted in Sainsbury, R. M. 2002. Departing From Frege. London, Routledge.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Wright, Crispin. 1992. Truth and Objectivity. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.

Wright, Crispin. 2004. On Epistemic Entitlement: Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free?). Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 78: 167-212.

[1] See for example Williamson 2000: chapter 4, Campbell 1987, and Sainsbury 1997.

[2] In the interests of space, I'm not going to lay out Bar-On's neo-expressivism in any detail here. I refer the interested reader to the discussion in an earlier review.

[3] This worry is inspired by the argument in Shapiro's paper on pages 233-4, which Wright has elsewhere labeled the EC-deduction.

[4] See Wright's reply (458). See also Lockard forthcoming for more or less the same point again in the context of a discussion of Zalabardo's treatment of the problem of easy knowledge.