Mind, Metaphysics, and Value in the Thomistic and Analytical Traditions

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Haldane, John (ed.), Mind, Metaphysics, and Value in the Thomistic and Analytical Traditions, University of Notre Dame Press, 2002, 260pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0268034672.

Reviewed by Jeffrey E. Brower, Purdue University


Until recently, Anglo-American philosophers—even those interested in the history of philosophy—tended to take a dim view of medieval philosophy, supposing that because of its close connection to theology, it had little to contribute to areas outside of philosophy of religion and philosophical theology. But after years of neglect, medieval philosophy has become a focus of attention, as a growing number of scholars have begun to recognize its value for illuminating areas of purely philosophical concern—areas such as metaphysics, logic, language, mind, ethics, action theory, and moral psychology.

The current volume reflects some of the vigor of this new trend in medieval philosophy. And its editor, John Haldane, who stands at the center of a movement known as ‘Analytical Thomism’, offers it with the following two-fold ecumenical aim: (1) to foster continuing interactions between medieval and analytic philosophy, especially with regard to the thought of Thomas Aquinas, and (2) to encourage intellectual exchange between the parties of different traditions of Thomistic scholarship. As Haldane says in the introduction: “the time is overdue for a broad movement bringing together the interests, knowledge, and expertise of traditional Thomists, analytical philosophers, and others appreciative of both traditions” (x).

The volume consists of twelve essays and a short introduction. With the exception of Haldane’s essay, which is largely reprinted from an earlier article, the essays all appear to be published here for the first time. In his introduction, Haldane emphasizes the dangers of attempting to explain the motivations or character of an edited volume, and thus excuses himself from the task of describing its content and organization. This is unfortunate since it can leave the impression that the essays are only loosely connected. Indeed, Haldane himself suggests at one point that the volume is more “like a buffet contributed to by several chefs, than an extended meal prepared by a single cook” (vii). Contrary to such appearances, however, the essays are in fact tightly organized around the three themes identified in the title: Mind, Metaphysics, and Value. Chapters 1-4 focus on issues in philosophy of mind and cognition, specifically the acquisition of knowledge or concepts; chapters 5-11 focus on issues in metaphysics, specifically action theory, individuation, and modality; and chapter 12 focuses on an aspect of Aquinas’s ethics, indicating its connection to his views about mind and metaphysics.

With respect to the second of its two aims, that of bringing together different traditions of Aquinas scholarship, I think the volume is unsuccessful. The bulk of its essays—chapters 2-11—are all written from a broadly analytic perspective and make no attempt to connect with the themes or literature of more traditional Thomistic scholarship. Moreover, the only two essays falling outside the analytic tradition—chapters 1 and 12—seem largely uninterested in interacting with this tradition. Thus, most analytically minded philosophers will, I suspect, find little of interest in Fergus Kerr’s comparison (in chap. 1) of Wittgenstein and Aquinas on the question of how one passes from the private to the public world, despite Kerr’s taking certain remarks of Anthony Kenny as his starting point. And many readers will be surprised by the fact that M.W.F. Stone’s essay (in chap. 12), which draws on important Thomistic discussions of natural law, contains no mention of Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann’s influential work on Aquinas’s ethical naturalism, despite Stone’s explicit aim to examine the extent to which Aquinas’s moral theory can be accurately described as naturalistic. It is fair to say that the only sense in which this volume brings together different traditions of Aquinas scholarship is by collecting pieces representative of them under a single binding.

With respect to its other aim, however, that of advancing the current level of interaction between medieval and analytic philosophers, the volume is much more successful. Haldane sets an extremely high standard for the volume by inviting comparison to “the genuinely pioneering work of Elizabeth Anscombe, Peter Geach, and Anthony Kenny, and the fine scholarship and argumentation associated with the Cornell group, with the late Norman Kretzmann at the centre of it” (x). None of the essays quite live up to the best work in this tradition, though no doubt part of the explanation is that the contributors appear to be working under significant length restrictions. Apart from Haldane’s essay, none of the others exceeds 20 pages (and Haldane’s is only 22). The result is that even the best essays feel overly compressed or rushed. Gyula Klima, for example, provides an extremely provocative and interesting comparison of Aristotelian essentialism, as understood by Aquinas, with the doctrine that goes by that name in contemporary philosophy. Because of its compression, however, it will be tough-going for anyone lacking at least some acquaintance with contemporary formal semantics.

Even so, the volume must be regarded as entirely successful in showing the potential value of medieval Aristotelianism, and Aquinas’s views in particular, for advancing, and in some cases even resolving, important debates in contemporary analytic philosophy. Almost all the essays are written by authors in command of analytic tools, methods, and problematics and their topics could not have been better chosen (e.g., “Aquinas and the Mind-Body Problem”, “The Breakdown of Contemporary Philosophy of Mind”, “Hylomorphism and Individuation”).

As a nice addition, the volume also includes two essays by relatively well-known analytic philosophers, David Braine (chap. 2) and David S. Oderberg (chap. 8), both of which are striking for the light they shed on particularly dark aspects of Aquinas’s metaphysics. Braine’s essay, for example, contains some tantalizing suggestions about the proper interpretation of intelligible species, and in particular the verbum or species expressa, and Oderberg’s essay contains a number of provocative suggestions about how to understand designated matter as a principle of individuation.

Among the most interesting, and accessible, essays of the volume are those by C.F.J Martin (chap. 5) and Stefaan E. Cuypers (chap. 6). Both deal with aspects of Thomistic action theory: Martin aims to identify the difference between voluntary and non-voluntary action in terms of the different types of causality associated with each, and Cuyper develops and defends a Thomistic theory of agent causation, taking as his point of departure some important recent work on Thomas Reid. Also interesting, but slightly more difficult, is Jonathan Jacobs’ treatment (chap. 7) of Aquinas’s contribution to an aspect of the current realism/anti-realism debate—namely, his account of the normativity of concept use. Here, as elsewhere, one gets a sense of just how fruitful the application of medieval views to contemporary debates can be—especially when the debates in question are currently at a standstill.

It is to be expected, in a volume of this sort, that individual essays will be stronger in some respects than others. Nonetheless, there are certain flaws that might have been avoided. Perhaps the most noticeable occur in the essays by Braine and Oderberg, which for all their interest, contain some surprising omissions or mistakes. In the case of Braine, these are primarily restricted to his treatment of philosophy and theology in Aquinas (18-22). Here he ignores a great deal of recent scholarship in assuming that Aquinas’s conception of philosophy and theology match our own. Because of this, he mistakenly concludes that the Summa Theologiae, along with other works that Aquinas would regard as theological, ought not to be included “among our starting-points for evaluating Aquinas as a philosopher” (19). In the case of Oderberg, the main problem concerns his understanding of the development of later medieval philosophy, and in particular the place that Aquinas’s views occupy in it. Thus, at one point he asserts (without qualification or defense) that “all schoolmen [were] obliged to hold the Thomistic opinion on all matters of philosophy as their default position” (126). This is a startling claim, one that no scholar I know of has undertaken to defend.1

These sorts of worries aside, the volume will appeal to anyone interested in seeing the value of reflecting from a contemporary point of view on the best of medieval thought. Because of their compression, the essays tend to be more successful at showing the promise that Thomistic principles hold for resolving longstanding difficulties, than they are at showing in detail how these principles in fact resolve them. Even so, they go a considerable distance toward bridging that gap which makes even the best known medieval philosophers, such as Aquinas, seem intellectually more remote than much earlier philosophers, such as Plato and Aristotle. At the same time, moreover, these essays demonstrate the type of work that must be done if medieval philosophy is ever to achieve the kind of recovery and appreciation already enjoyed by the neighboring fields of ancient and early modern philosophy.2


1. Since the publication of this review, David Oderberg has informed me that when he speaks of 'schoolman' in the passage just quoted, he means to be referring, not to the medieval scholastics themselves, as I had assumed, but "to all those in the present who consider themselves in one way or another to be upholding, reviving, or enhancing the tradition of the medieval scholastics". I think my original reading is still the natural one, and that Oderberg's claim is false even on his intended reading (since there are many today who qualify as schoolmen in his sense but feel no obligation to start from the Thomist position). Nonetheless, I appreciate his intention and see that it does make a difference to the plausibility of his claim.

2. I am grateful to Michael Bergmann and Susan Brower-Toland for helpful comments and suggestions on an earlier draft.