Mind, Morality, and Explanation: Selected Collaborations

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Jackson, Frank, Pettit, Philip, and Smith, Michael, Mind, Morality, and Explanation: Selected Collaborations, Oxford University Press, 2004, 440pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199253374.

Reviewed by Timothy Schroeder, University of Manitoba


Mind, Morality, and Explanation brings together seventeen previously published papers sharing the common feature of having been co-authored by some combination of Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit, and Michael Smith (hereafter FJ, PP, and MS). Ten papers are from FJ and PP, five from PP and MS, one features all three, and one is by FJ, MS, and Graham Oppy. They range over topics in philosophical psychology, the philosophy of explanation, meta-ethics, and moral psychology, and yet display a number of thematic and argumentative connections that link the papers into a larger whole, a cohesive vision of the mind and its place in the realms of causation and morality.

Perhaps the best way to sum up Mind, Morality, and Explanation is to paint, in broad strokes, the picture that emerges pointillistically from the essays when read one at a time. That picture begins with the semantics of theoretical terms. Following Lewis, it is held that theoretical terms get their meanings from the theoretical networks in which they are embedded. This thesis is first applied to the philosophy of mind, where it is held that folk psychology is a theory, but one whose posits are modest, claiming little more than that there exist states in the heads of oneself and others that mediate the familiar input-output patterns. A happy lemma is that eliminative materialism is an intelligible doctrine but false. Lewis’s approach is also applied to moral terms. For example, to be a belief about what it would be fair to do is to be something that leads to the creation of a fairness-directed desire under normal conditions, because this is the role folk moral theory attributes to such beliefs. Whether or not such beliefs actually exist is the subject of controversy between moral cognitivists and non-cognitivists, but that this is what it takes to be such a belief follows straightforwardly from the correct theory of theoretical terms. And, just as folk psychology was vindicated by the existence of beliefs and desires in general, so too, one gets the impression, will folk morality be vindicated by the existence of suitably cognitive moral beliefs, though here the arguments are largely gestures toward work by MS.

One thing that follows from treating theoretical terms as being defined by their theoretical roles is that the properties named by these terms will prove to play their roles essentially, at least in substantial measure. For instance, given that desiring is simply a matter of having some realization of an appropriate (long-armed) functional role that leads from perception to action, one might worry that one cannot non-vacuously explain how perception leads to action by appeal to desiring. Desiring no more explains action than fragility explains breaking or dormitive virtues explain soporific powers, it might seem. To head off such worries, a theory of causal explanation is developed by FJ and PP in which a distinction is drawn between properties that participate causally in bringing about events and properties that, while not participating directly, are nonetheless relevant in causal explanation. Functionally characterized macro-properties, properties capable of multiple micro-realizations, are held to be such relevant but not directly efficacious properties. Hence the causal work done by one’s desiring is really, in some sense, being done by a particular collection of microphysical particles instantiating microphysical properties, but one can legitimately mention one’s desire in an explanation because the fact of one’s desiring guarantees that some such microphysical story or other – one leading to the causal outcome – is correct. This theory of explanatory relevance ensures, not only that mental states will be explanatorily relevant to what we do, but also that their broad contents will be explanatorily relevant: another happy lemma. Likewise, it allows for the explanatory relevance of higher-level social properties, such as unemployment levels, corporate policy, and urbanization, in spite of there being lower-level and typically individualistic explanations of how these properties achieve their effects on any given occasion.

The picture of beliefs and desires that emerges from the espoused brand of functionalism is also put to work in moral psychology by PP and MS. There it is applied to draw the conclusion that, although desires are always causally effective when action is produced (this being the role folk psychology gives them), they are not always objects of deliberation when action is produced, not even sub-conscious or unconscious deliberation. Desires have a compulsory role in the “background” but not the “foreground” of action production. This conclusion is then pressed into service to support an argument that what is important in autonomy might better be named ’orthonomy’: being (background) motivated in accordance with one’s (foreground) deliberation upon whatever one values. Orthonomy breaks down when one is moved by background desires for ends not matching one’s foregrounded values: either to do the valued thing for the wrong reason or to do some less valued thing. Possession of orthonomy is of special interest because, being the sorts of creatures capable of bringing our effective desires into alignment with our deliberatively reached values, we are the sorts of creatures that we recognize as worth debating and indeed the sort that we recognize as free and responsible. Orthonomy is thus the compatibilistic ground of free will in creatures possessing it.

This broad overview gives the flavor of what is to be found in Mind, Morality, and Explanation, but it is lacking a certain level of detail. Let me say a little about some of the arguments that stood out for me. “In Defence of Folk Psychology” and “Folk Belief and Commonplace Belief” (both papers by FJ and PP) make the case that believing and desiring, though functionally characterized states, are correctly characterized in such modest, commonsensical terms that there is no threat of eliminativism. As a philosopher of mind who prefers to think of terms such as ’belief’ and ’desire’ as (functional) natural kind terms, I wondered how FJ and PP would convince me to hold their more modest conception of the attitudes. “In Defence …” proposes to take those folk posits about belief and desire that are actually used to predict and explain behavior to be the theoretical posits definitive of these attitudes; other folk posits are not important. On the question of whether folk psychology requires that a belief that P be realized by just one brain state, for instance, FJ and PP write, “It does not matter for the success of our passage back and forth between situations, behaviour, beliefs, and desires how many states inside the agent are required to work the trick. Perhaps we folk suppose that there is only one state, but this supposition plays no essential role in how we predict behaviour from information about beliefs, desires, and situations. The unitary assumption may be a bit of folk supposition, one which will perhaps turn out to be a bit of folk mythology, but it is not part and parcel of the folk theory […] that forms the core of the folk conception of belief and desire” (p. 24). “Folk Belief …” agrees that folk psychology might encompass more controversial claims about causal relations, causal powers, hidden natures, and so on, but again suggests that folk psychology is not so far removed from “commonplace psychology,” which is folk psychology with all of its controversial claims expunged. Commonplace psychology’s posits are clearly realized; the question is whether they are really beliefs, desires, and so on, but this question is not given much attention. “Our conviction—unargued here—is that commonplace psychology is quite similar to folk psychology, and, in particular, similar enough for commonplace belief and commonplace desire to count as belief and desire” (p. 42). In the light of these fairly sketchy remarks, the philosopher who begins these papers unconvinced of this key point is unlikely to become convinced. Yet those who began by accepting the brand of functionalism FJ and PP characterize will rightly be impressed by the refutation of eliminativism that follows from this key premise.

A feature just highlighted in the two papers above is one that recurs frequently throughout Mind, Morality, and Explanation. Many of the papers are what might be called “one move” papers: the sort in which a single idea, often ingenious, carries the paper so long as one is happy about the paper’s presuppositions, but which leaves one unsatisfied otherwise, for the presuppositions are typically given sketchy defenses. In a number of cases, I was inclined to agree with the presuppositions and found “the move” convincing; in a number of others, such as those above, I was left cold through being unconvinced of the truth of a key presupposition.

In this regard, FJ and PP’s paper “Moral Functionalism and Moral Motivation” was a standout, for it was so ingenious at “the move” that I was intrigued in spite of being unsympathetic to the essential presuppositions. This paper holds that “moral terms are specified by their role in received moral theory—in ’folk moral theory’—and while this theory has a purely descriptive content, so that we can understand the answerability of evaluation to descriptive considerations, the content of any one claim is fixed only so far as the contents of others are fixed simultaneously” (p. 194). That is, FJ and PP suggest extending common-sense functionalism’s account of mental terms to moral theory, giving parallel common-sense functional accounts of moral terms. They then go on to suggest that part of the folk moral theory surrounding moral terms is that a judgment that one action option is more fair “tends to arouse a desire for the realization of the option” and so lead us to the conclusion that beliefs of fairness necessarily motivate (under normal conditions) because this is partially constitutive of what makes something a belief in the fairness of an action. Furthermore, because abnormal conditions are required for the failure of such motivation, it can also be said that ideal agents are motivated to be fair, and this is some reason for the non-ideal agent to consider himself to have a reason to be fair. These conclusions are not unique to FJ and PP, but the route to the conclusions is one I found a fertile application of ideas more commonly deployed in the philosophy of mind and philosophy of language, and perhaps the best case for interdisciplinarity in the collection.

At least two other papers deserve particular attention. “Practical Unreason,” by PP and MS, is an attempt to explain how practical irrationality can be possible without recourse to theoretical irrationality. They begin by distinguishing the effect that cognitive awareness of properties in the world has upon deliberation, which weighs and values these properties, from the effect such awareness has upon intentional action. “In rational action the values which lead an agent to prescribe one option to herself—to see it as desirable, all things considered—are also the values which lead her to choose that option. The values that weigh with the agent in deliberation serve also to arouse a desire for the option which they deliberatively support” (p. 328). But if this is rational action, then pure irrational action is straightforward: the deliberative weighing of the valuable properties that might be realized comes apart from the desires that are aroused. Either the desires formed are for an end other than that judged most valuable, or the desires formed are for the end judged valuable, but the desires are aroused by awareness of something other than what one judges valuable in the end. One thing to say by way of objection is that this explanation of practical irrationality attributes far too much authority to deliberation: there is a powerful case to be made that, in certain circumstances, one can act more reasonably contrary to deliberation than in accordance with it, as Nomy Arpaly argues in Unprincipled Virtue (New York: Oxford University Press, 2003). Another objection might be that, if it is granted that desires are sometimes formed in accordance with deliberation upon values that might be realized, but sometimes formed independently of such deliberations, then explaining how practical irrationality is possible requires explaining how this separation is possible, yet this is something PP and MS neglect to do.

In response to this second objection, it would not be unreasonable to imagine PP and MS suggesting that their interlocutor turn to FJ and PP’s “Program Explanation: A General Perspective.” For, while it is reasonable to ask how, exactly, reliable but not invariable correlations between deliberative judgments of value and desire are achieved, it might also be answered that such explanations are at a lower, implementation level and that providing such details is not required for an explanation at the psychological level to be a good one; and such an answer might draw strength from “Program Explanation.” In this paper, FJ and PP seek to show that properties need not be causally efficacious in order to feature in good causal explanations: properties need only be causally relevant to feature in good explanations, and a property can be causally relevant simply by “programming” for the existence of some property that is causally efficacious. Programming is understood by FJ and PP to be the relation between a higher-level property and a lower-level one when the higher-level property is instantiated in virtue of the lower-level one being instantiated. Knowing that a higher-level property is instantiated does not allow one to know what lower-level property makes this the case and so hides some of the causal story from one. However, it does allow one to know that some such lower-level property was instantiated, and so one still has some additional information about the causal history of the production of the phenomenon being explained. This, FJ and PP hold, is all that is required to legitimate appeal to a higher-level property in a causal explanation. Applying the ideas to the topic of “Practical Unreason,” one might say that the possibility of practical irrationality is programmed for by the existence of value judgments and desires but that in particular cases the actualization of practical irrationality will be explainable only in a very minimal way by saying “the agent had value judgments and desires and so was susceptible to this sort of thing.” A more interesting explanation will be found only at a lower level.

Overall, Mind, Morality, and Explanation is an outstanding anthology precisely because it justifies the decision to bring its papers together not merely on the usual grounds of accessibility, loose thematic connection, or happenstance, but on intellectual grounds: reading these papers as a whole leads one to appreciate one way of understanding the mind that might not be appreciated otherwise. It can be recommended to any philosopher working on at least one of its focal topics who is ready to broaden her horizons and see what the big picture might look like when explored by some of the leaders of contemporary philosophy.