Mind, Reason, and Being-in-the-World: The McDowell-Dreyfus Debate

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Joseph K. Schear (ed.), Mind, Reason, and Being-in-the-World: The McDowell-Dreyfus Debate, Routledge, 2013, 348pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415485876.

Reviewed by Wayne Christensen, Macquarie University


The central question in the debate between John McDowell and Hubert Dreyfus concerns the extent to which perceptual content is readily available to conceptual understanding. According to McDowell, all human perceptual experience is pervaded by conceptuality in the sense that the content of experience is amenable to uptake by conceptual reasoning processes such as the making of judgments. Even where there is no existing language-based conceptualization for an experience, as in the case where an individual perceives a shade of color for which they have no name, the experience can be retained in memory and be the object of reasoning processes. Dreyfus argues against McDowell that skillful absorbed coping involves a profoundly non-conceptual form of experience. This debate taps into deep questions about action, agency and reason, and one of the pleasures of Schear's book is the breadth and depth it brings to the discussion. With the debate as the focal (or jumping off) point, the contributors explore the historical and large-scale philosophical context, the nature of embodied skill, perceptual content, conceptuality, and rationality. As a whole the book provides a rich and nuanced investigation of the issues in dispute.

But if the picture this investigation yields is rich, it is not entirely clear. Joseph Schear's chapter provides a nice articulation of what may be the most fundamental element in Dreyfus's critique of McDowell. Schear points out that paradigmatic exercises of rationality, such as making a judgment or acting intentionally, involve the presence of determinate thinkable objects that serve as the topic (294). Thus, in the case of the judgment Spring has begun, spring is the object. In the case of the intentional action walking across the street, the object of the action is walking across the street. The presence of thinkable objects for the agent is the grounding point for rational engagement with the world because these objects can figure in reasons used for the reflective evaluation and justification of judgments and actions. Without thinkable objects, reason can get no purchase. But Schear points out that there is no experience of determinate objects in fully absorbed coping, according to Dreyfus's account. Thus, Dreyfus in his opening chapter says that "in fully absorbed coping, mind and world cannot be separated. . . . we are directly merged into a field of attractive and repulsive forces." (27-28) Schear argues that this field of solicitations cannot be grasped cognitively, even retrospectively, because it is not composed of thinkable elements that could be held onto and reidentified.

It is important to distinguish this kind of pure responsivity from other forms of engaged action. In a passage discussed by Dreyfus (28), Taylor Carman (169), and Charles Siewert (195), Sartre describes a somewhat different kind of experience:

When I run after a streetcar, when I look at the time, when I am absorbed in contemplating a portrait, there is no I. . . . I am then plunged into the world of objects . . . it is they which present themselves . . . with attractive and repellent qualities -- but me, I have disappeared.[1]

Here there are thinkable objects: physical objects and affordances are present to awareness. Dreyfus acknowledges that absorbed coping can include awareness of objects and affordances,[2] but he doesn't believe that such awareness will be characteristic of skilled action. He argues that skilled activity will be characterized by dispositional responsivity honed through extensive experience (35), and that awareness intrudes only when there is resistance or breakdown (31). In consequence of this, Dreyfus claims that experts will generally be unable to give reasons for their actions (35).

Many of the contributors don't fully recognize the specific structure of Dreyfus's phenomenology of absorbed coping, failing to differentiate it from the object-present phenomenology described by Sartre. And no contributor clearly addresses the theoretical account of skill acquisition that plays a key role in supporting Dreyfus's account of the phenomenology. In consequence, there is an overall failure to come directly to grips with the central elements of Dreyfus's critique of McDowell.

McDowell's own chapter exemplifies this problem. McDowell agrees with Dreyfus that an account of human agency must accommodate acting in flow, and McDowell claims that his account does so without difficulty (45). In the earlier exchanges Dreyfus raised two examples of expert flow and its breakdown: blitz chess, where there is putatively no time to think, and the problems that the baseball player Chuck Knoblauch experienced with throwing, which Dreyfus attributes to thinking about his throwing. McDowell claims that even if Knoblauch didn't attend to his actions when playing well, he knew what he was doing and why -- he was throwing to first base to get a runner out (53). And McDowell likewise claims that an absorbed chess master knows what he is doing and will be able to explain why he made a given move (47).

But McDowell doesn't do enough to substantiate the claim that experts generally know what they are doing. Experts will no doubt be able to give banal facts about what they were doing after the performance (of the kind 'I was trying to get him out'), and in many cases will also be able to give analyses that provide reasons for a given action. But banal facts don't capture the detailed sensitivities that explain why a particular action was performed at a particular time. And if Dreyfus is right, then elaborated after-the-fact explanations for actions will be reconstructions that do not accurately describe the situational sensitivities that actually guided the actions. The expert can't give accurate explanations for actions because the guiding sensitivities don't present themselves to the individual in a cognitively graspable form. McDowell thus asserts a contrary position, but he doesn't address the most damaging problem for his account that Dreyfus raises, or undermine the rationale that Dreyfus gives for his account of absorbed coping.

Lee Braver, Joseph Rouse, and Carman also do not fully appreciate the strongly non-cognitive nature of Dreyfus's absorbed coping, while Robert Pippin does, but does not develop a challenge. Braver argues that we should apply Dreyfus's model of absorbed coping to thinking itself, claiming that thinking involves responding to solicitations no less than does action (152-55). But this is evidently presupposing an object-present version of the phenomenology of absorbed coping, rather than Dreyfus's pure responsivity. Braver isn't claiming that thoughts have no graspable contents, but rather that they are evoked by solicitations. Dreyfus does give masterful oration as an example of fully absorbed coping (28), but Dreyfus's model of fully absorbed coping can't be applied to thinking if we assume that thinking incorporates graspable content. Pippin argues that we can explain engaged perception as conceptual without saying that it is judgmental, and he suggests that Dreyfus's phenomenology is inadequate (104), but he doesn't provide an elaborated argument.

Rouse argues that we should distinguish between descriptive and normative approaches to the conceptual domain, with descriptive accounts being concerned with whether concepts are actually present and operative, and normative accounts being concerned with whether performances and capacities can be appropriately assessed according to rational norms. What matters for normative assessment is not whether conceptual capacities are actually operative, but whether thought and action are sufficiently accessible and responsive to conceptual assessment (250-51). Rouse claims that McDowell and Dreyfus are concerned with normative and descriptive issues respectively, and that their main points are compatible (254). Dreyfus should agree that chess players understand chess and that chess playing is accountable to this understanding (if it isn't, the individuals aren't playing chess). McDowell should agree that the patterns recognized by chess experts may have no higher-order articulation.

But Rouse here misunderstands the nature of Dreyfus's position. Dreyfus is clear that experts do engage in rational evaluation when things go wrong, so he will no doubt agree that performances are normatively assessable -- at least in some way. But rational evaluation can't capture the fine-grained sensitivities that yield successful performance at the expert level. As a guide to action, analysis only yields competence, so it is a scaffold that the expert abandons. There is an important sense, then, in which expert agency is opaque to rational understanding. It is subject to coarse-grained normative assessment, but not fine-grained evaluation that captures the causal structure of action. McDowell thus cannot accept Dreyfus's account of the phenomenology of absorbed coping without giving up his claim that experience is ubiquitously accessible to conceptual understanding.

Carman discusses Sartre's streetcar passage and claims that the phenomenology depicted is not a threat to McDowell's conceptualism because it includes awareness of thinkable content (169). This doesn't take into account the differences between Dreyfus's account of the phenomenology of absorbed coping and Sartre's description. But Carman goes on to note that there may be forms of unreflective content that cannot be easily conceptualized, and he argues that such content plays a crucial guiding role in conversation. Sensitivities to nuances of tempo, reciprocity, mood, duration, and subject matter all contribute to flowing conversation, but are not conducive to conceptual recognition and rational reflection (174). An important implication is that Dreyfus's stringent account of absorbed coping isn't the only basis for criticizing McDowell. McDowell's claim that experience is generally amenable to conceptual articulation is undermined even when experience includes thinkable content, so long as the experience also includes structure that is difficult to articulate.

Dan Zahavi criticizes Dreyfus's claim that absorbed coping is so absorbed that there is a complete loss of conscious awareness and subjectivity, and argues that Dreyfus's account is not in fact consistent with the phenomenological tradition. Zahavi points to textual evidence that Sartre and Heidegger both claimed that pre-reflective experience includes an implicit self-awareness (328). Zahavi thus opts for the kind of phenomenology of absorbed coping presented in Sartre's streetcar passage, which includes both explicit awareness of objects with affordances and implicit self-awareness, in preference to Dreyfus's total absorption.

Alva Noë, Siewert, Tim Crane and Susanna Schellenberg all give accounts of perceptual experience that differ from that of Dreyfus, but they don't directly address the issue of the role of dispositional sensitivities in action and the problem this poses for conceptual understanding. For this reason I won't consider them here. (For reasons of space I also won't discuss the chapters by Taylor and Sebastian Gardner, which are principally concerned with the larger philosophical programs that inform the debate).

Of all the contributors, only Barbara Montero directly challenges Dreyfus's empirical claims about expertise. She argues that Dreyfus's account is part of a widespread view that expert performance is automatic, common in sport and popular culture, found also in Taoism, and codified in theories of skill acquisition in cognitive psychology (306-08). She attributes the popularity of the view to several sources, including the idea that thinking interferes with action, neural evidence that skill acquisition results in reduced brain activation during performance, and reports by experts that high level performance is effortless and without thought. Montero attacks each of these sources in turn, building a case that expert action can be richly minded. She criticizes Dreyfus's interpretation of Knoblauch's throwing problem as caused by thinking about what he was doing, noting that Knoblauch did not claim this (309). Montero's positive evidence for mindedness in expert action centers on her experiences as a ballet dancer and her discussions with other dancers. She describes deliberating about how best to respond to the music with movement, and using self-directed instructions to stay focused on the task, such as whispering "stretch-lift-whoosh" (312-13). She points out that even the best dancers are not perfect, and that those at the highest level characteristically have an intense commitment to ongoing improvement (303, 314). She says that performances on autopilot lack interest for the dancer and result in performances without spark (314).

Montero's chapter throws into question framing empirical assumptions employed by many of the other authors. McDowell, Pippin, Braver, Carman, Rouse, and Zahavi all assume that Dreyfus's account of the phenomenology of skilled action is approximately right, even if they differ over details. Thus, Zahavi prefers a richer phenomenology that includes pre-reflective self-awareness, but he doesn't dispute the idea that skilled engagement with the world is generally non-reflective. But if Montero is right, this is incorrect. This problem underlines the fact that the debate as a whole has weak empirical grounding. Braver claims that Dreyfus has assembled an impressive array of evidence in support of his position (144), but in fact Dreyfus makes little contact with the extensive body of empirical research on skills and expertise.[3] Systematic empirical grounding is important for understanding the cognitive and motor mechanisms of skill learning and performance, but it is also important for developing a clearer understanding of the phenomenology. Carman observes that phenomenology is hard, and that reflection tends to distort the experience reflected upon (165). Zahavi likewise notes that reflection can distort experience, but suggests that so long as reflection retains self-critical awareness of this danger it retains its value (333). Arguably, though, this is not enough -- also required is systematic empirical investigation. For example, recent investigations of the performance experiences of musicians have found much greater complexity than Dreyfus supposes.[4]

Stronger empirical framing might help bring some of the conceptual issues into better focus. Montero rightly argues that we should distinguish elite skills from everyday coping, but we should also distinguish different kinds of elite skills and different forms of everyday activity. The degree of absorption in skilled activity can vary greatly, and some everyday activities may be relatively thoughtless precisely because we are not absorbed. It is also important to examine patterns of awareness across extended periods of time. Sartre's streetcar passage captures well the loss of explicit self-awareness that can occur with a strong focus on a particular objective. But it is a mistake to generalize from these kinds of experiences to the claim that skilled action in general lacks explicit self-awareness. Even in the case of running to catch a streetcar, forms of explicit self-awareness can come into play, such as awareness of being close enough and running fast enough that you will probably now make it before the last passengers board and the streetcar leaves.

This returns us to the question of the extent to which experience is amenable to conceptual understanding. If Montero is right, then conceptual understanding makes a direct contribution to elite skilled performance, but this does not necessarily indicate that the experiences of the elite performer are in general readily amenable to conceptual understanding. It is very plausible that skill acquisition usually involves the development of complex dispositional sensitivities that are not easily articulated in conceptual cognition; moreover, in some cases conceptual awareness is systematically in error. Many cricket batsmen have believed that performing well requires keeping one's eye on the ball, and they have had the strong experience of doing so, but experimental research has shown that they do not in fact keep their eye on the ball.[5] This suggests that we shouldn't confidently assume that experts generally 'know what they are doing', in the sense of having a full understanding. But experts may nevertheless sometimes have a partial but quite detailed understanding of what they are doing. Montero distinguishes between analytic cognitive processes that occur in practice and more qualitative, holistic forms of awareness during performance. One possibility is that there is an interplay in which strongly analytic forms of cognition outside of performance help in the development of conceptualizations that contribute to awareness during performance, and to the interpretation of performance after it has occurred. This interplay would help to mesh the online cognition of performance with the analytic cognition of training, preparation, and post-performance evaluation.


Dreyfus, H. L. (2007). The Return of the Myth of the Mental. Inquiry, 50(4), 352-365.

Geeves, A., McIlwain, D. J. F., Sutton, J., and Christensen, W. (2014). To Think or Not To Think: The apparent paradox of expert skill in music performance. Educational Philosophy and Theory, 46(6), 674-691.

Høffding, S. (2014). What is skilled coping?: Experts on Expertise. Journal of Consciousness Studies, 21(9-10), 49-73.

Prince, C. and Salas, E. (1998), Situation assessment for routine flight and decision making. International Journal of Cognitive Ergonomics 1(4), 315-324.

Sartre, J.-P. (1957). Transcendence of the Ego, trans. F. Williams and R. Kirkpatrick. NY: The Noonday Press.

Sutton, J. (2007). Batting, Habit and Memory: The Embodied Mind and the Nature of Skill. Sport in Society, 10(5), 763-786.

[1] Sartre 1957, pp. 48-49.

[2] See Dreyfus 2007, p. 358.

[3] Some of this work is broadly supportive of his account, but some of it is not. For example, there is evidence that highly experienced pilots engage in more analysis than less experienced pilots, and this contributes to their ability to understand and respond quickly to problems when they arise. See, e.g., Prince and Salas 1998.

[4] See Geeves et al. 2014 and Høffding 2014.

[5] See Sutton 2007.