Mind, Self and Person

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Anthony O'Hear, Mind, Self and Person, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 330pp., $39.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781107545663.

Reviewed by Kristina Musholt, Leipzig University


This volume brings together fourteen essays by distinguished scholars on questions relating to the mind, to the self, and to personhood. The papers are based on the lectures given in the Royal Institute of Philosophy's London Lecture series in 2013-14. The large majority of them cover original material; some are adaptations or extensions of previously published work, while one is a précis of a recent monograph. The papers are generally of a very high quality, as can be expected given the choice of contributors.

In terms of topics covered, it is interesting to note how many of the papers deal with the metaphysics of the self and personal identity, and with the traditional mind-body problem. It is striking that several of the contributions explicitly discuss Derek Parfit's view that we are not human beings (though Parfit himself is not among the contributors). Moreover, quite a few of the papers engage with the views of early modern philosophers (in particular Descartes, Hume, and Locke), reflecting the fact that the traditional divide between historical and systematic approaches is -- fortunately -- increasingly being rejected. Somewhat surprisingly, there is comparatively little coverage of the topic of social cognition. Also somewhat surprisingly, there is relatively little direct engagement with empirical research -- with the notable exceptions of David Bakhurst's essay, which appeals to research in developmental psychology, and of Patricia S. Churchland's, which essentially provides a neuroscientific account of social behavior. There are also large variations in terms of length, style, and accessibility. Some papers are rather short and try to be broadly accessible, albeit sometimes at the cost of brushing over important details; while others consist of rather extensive engagements with arguments that require substantive prior familiarity with the issues on the part of the reader. While most follow the style of writing commonly found in analytical philosophy, some stand out, such as P. M. S. Hacker's essay, which consists of a conversation between three imaginary characters (two philosophers and a neuroscientist), who are joined by Descartes and Aristotle. Overall, the volume will be of most interest to scholars working in the area, while it will be of rather limited use as an introduction to the field.

My aim in the following will be to provide a brief overview of the individual essays and to draw out some connections between them in order to give readers a general sense of the volume. In the interest of relating articles to each other where possible, the order of discussion here does not mirror the order of contributions in the book.

The first contribution, by Mark Sprevak and David Statham, criticizes one of Robert Rupert's main arguments against group minds. Group minds come into play in certain explanations of intelligent behavior, namely those that ascribe mental states to entities such as corporations or other groups (as in "Volkswagen manipulated their diesel engines' emissions control"; "Apple is working on a new product", etc.). According to Rupert, for any such explanation, an alternative explanation is available, which appeals solely to the minds of individuals. As individual-level explanations are simpler than group-level explanations, the former are, all else being equal, to be preferred. Sprevak and Statham argue than on any of three possible construals of simplicity, namely qualitative parsimony, quantitative parsimony, and theoretical elegance, individual-level explanations are not always simpler than group-level explanations. Hence, this particular argument against group minds fails. While their argument is persuasive, it stands rather isolated from the other topics covered in the volume. Moreover, as the authors themselves point out, there might well be other arguments that speak against group minds.

Paul F. Snowdon's essay argues that, contrary to what has been assumed in much of the tradition of the philosophy of mind, the mind-body problem is actually not one that philosophy can be expected to solve. This is because the problem consists in determining the real nature of conscious states, and this is a task for the empirical sciences rather than for philosophy. On his view, anti-materialist arguments generally rely on modal intuitions, which are themselves unsupported. Pro-materialist arguments, on the other hand, either involve premises that only materialists would be inclined to accept, or are contingent for their success on the outcomes of empirical research. As Snowdon himself admits, his arguments are presented in rather broad strokes and ignore many of the subtleties of the relevant debates (which should come as no surprise, given the venerable history of the mind-body problem in the philosophy of mind), thus leaving plenty of scope for attack. Nonetheless, the essay certainly succeeds in providing food for thought and inviting the reader to contemplate its broader implications for the philosophy of mind (and metaphysics more generally). Snowdon's arguments will provide welcome grist to the mills of those (including many neuroscientists) who harbor a general skepticism towards the relevance of philosophy when it comes to ontological questions -- whether with respect to the mind or more generally speaking. His thoughts thus echo Sellars' dictum that "in the dimension of describing and explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not" (Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind, §42).

Interestingly, Snowdon's arguments stand in direct opposition to many of the other projects pursued in this volume. Hacker's contribution, for example, attempts to show that, quite to the contrary of what Snowdon suggests, it is well within philosophy's remit to tackle the mind-body problem. The way in which it should proceed in doing so is by conceptual analysis. However, Hacker's "intellectual entertainment" suggests that both the Cartesian anti-materialist's and the materialist's arguments are misguided based on the fact that the question of how the mind is related to the body is itself a misguided question (and hence one that neither philosophy nor the empirical sciences can be expected to answer -- instead of solving the mind-body problem, philosophy has the tools to dissolve it). Instead, what we need is a return to the Aristotelian examination of the powers of the human rational being. On this view, having a mind is not to be understood as a relation, but rather in terms of having certain capacities and abilities. What these are, Hacker suggests, might be revealed by an examination of such phrases as "having a thought cross one's mind", "having something in mind", and so on. So while Hacker asserts, in contrast to Snowdon, that it is philosophy, rather than science, which can determine the nature of mind, his remarks also suggest that the choice is not between a (reductive) materialist and an anti-materialist view of the mind to begin with.

While Snowdon argues that it is the task of science rather than philosophy to determine the nature of mind and consciousness, and Hacker holds the opposite view, Ted Honderich can be read as proposing to take the middle way. In his précis of his recent book Actual Consciousness, he presents a theory of consciousness that is thoroughly naturalistic and conceives of consciousness as being in principle amenable to scientific inquiry, while also aiming to do justice to the subjectivity of consciousness and acknowledging the need for philosophical work on the topic. On his view, "consciousness is subjectively physical". Put differently, "physicality in general consists in objective and also subjective physicality". He argues that disagreements in the literature over the nature of consciousness are a result of people actually talking past each other. In order to remedy this situation he proposes to begin with a "wide figurative database" of aspects that are ordinarily associated with consciousness, which he then proceeds to analyze. The analysis reveals that consciousness is not a uniform phenomenon (and so there is no general mind-body problem), but that instead different types of consciousness -- i.e., perceptual, cognitive, and affective consciousness -- possess different features, all of which are proper subjects of both scientific and philosophical study.

Having been treated somewhat dismissively by both Snowdon and Hacker, Descartes takes center stage again in Lucy O'Brien's essay -- though this time he is cast in a more flattering light. O'Brien's aim is to defend the Cartesian "Cogito" argument against a recent attack by John Campbell. According to Campbell, in order to move from the engagement in an act of thinking to the judgment that it is oneself who is thinking one must already assume one's existence. If so, the Cogito is question-begging. (The alternative is that it doesn't get off the ground to begin with.) O'Brien's counter-argument is conditional: if thinking is an active mode of human beings (much like walking is, for that matter), and if conscious thinking puts one into a direct relation to one's activity, then it should also put one into a direct relation to oneself, as that of which conscious thinking is a mode. If so, O'Brien concludes, there is room for the possibility that the Cogito could establish one's own existence in a non-question begging way, after all.

This raises the question of what this self, that one is arguably put in relation with, might be. This issue is discussed by several of the contributions, beginning with Eric T. Olson's critical discussion of Parfit's view on the self. According to Parfit, we are not human beings. Rather, each of us is a part of a human being, namely that part which thinks in the strictest sense (presumably your brain or some part of it). This view is supposed to solve various metaphysical problems, namely the 'thinking-animal problem', the 'transplant problem', the 'remnant-person problem', and the 'thinking-parts problem'. For instance, suppose your brain were transplanted into another person's head. Who would the resulting person be -- you (with a new body), or the other (with a new brain)? Animalism -- the view that we are human organisms -- would imply the latter, but according to Parfit this is counter-intuitive. His own view would imply the former, which is taken to be the more plausible view. However, according to Olson, Parfit's own view faces other metaphysical problems. For instance, there doesn't seem to be a straightforward answer to the question of which part of the organism is the subject strictly speaking. Any answer you might give to this question raises its own troubling questions, Olson argues. Moreover, it seems to run into troubles with any account -- including Parfit's own -- that ties personal identity to psychological continuity.

Barry Dainton, on the other hand, argues that the problems that Olson raises for the view that we are parts of human organisms can be overcome. On Dainton's view, subjects are what he calls C-systems, that is "collections of capacities for unified states and streams of consciousness". These, in turn, are dispositional properties of the brain. Contra Olson, Dainton maintains that it is not impossible to specify which parts of the organism are directly responsible for its various experiential capacities. With respect to Olson's worry that this would lead us to postulate many different subjects within one organism (each subject identical to a particular experiential capacity, such as the ability to see faces, taste chocolate, or experience tooth-ache) Dainton points out that as long as different capacities contribute to one unified stream of consciousness, there is only one subject.

Rory Madden, in turn, proposes a radical alternative to what he calls the compositionalist view, according to which ordinary objects -- including human selves -- are to be characterized at the most basic level in terms of the way in which they are built up from their parts. Madden argues that the compositional view threatens our ordinary conception of what humans are. This is because there are any number of ways in which objects can be composed of parts. For example, "there are millions of massively overlapping pluralities of atoms" in your chair right now. If we do not want to restrict the operation of composition arbitrarily, then this implies that in addition to your self, there are in fact "a multiplicity of human selves" in your chair. But this obviously seems to go against the way we ordinarily think about human selves. Alternatively, one could hold that the only things that exist are "the non-composite, fundamental building blocks of reality". But on this view, rather than there being a multitude of selves in your chair right now, it turns out that there are no such things as selves at all. Madden's solution is to simply deny that at the most fundamental level ordinary objects are composites. Instead we should think of them in terms of the high-level law-like activity of things of their kind. As Madden points out, this view of what humans are is also recommended by the relevant sciences (ie., those sciences that are actually concerned with humans and the ordinary objects of human experience), such as biology, psychology, anthropology, and so on. Madden also suggests that it is a mistake to think that there can only be one science that defines our true nature. Instead, we should remind ourselves that "the human self is at once the fruitful object of study of biology, ecology, psychology, anthropology, sociology, history, and so on". Thus, we can be naturalists about human selves without being reductionist -- and without having to choose between animalism and psychologism. However, this view also implies that there won't be any specific criterion for personal identity; an implication that some might find troubling. Moreover, it is not obvious that the objections Madden raises against the compositionalist view would also apply to a view such as the one defended by Dainton.

Continuing the theme of engaging with questions of personal identity and with early modern philosophy, Galen Strawson's paper provides an elaborate defense of Locke's account of personal identity against the charges of inconsistency and circularity. On his reading, these charges are a result of misreading Locke; in particular, of failing to appreciate Locke's use of "person" as a forensic term. In contrast to the way in which Locke is commonly interpreted, Strawson argues that his concern was not with the persistence conditions of subjects of experience, but rather with the properties that a subject needs to possess in order to qualify as a person and with the question of moral responsibility. Arguably, the distinctions drawn by Strawson are not just relevant for an interpretation of Locke's view, but also bear interesting implications for the views on personal identity held by contemporary authors.

Indeed, Lynne Rudder Baker's paper demonstrates that it can be instructive to distinguish between selves and persons, both for theoretical and practical concerns (though this is not to say that her distinctions are equivalent to those drawn by Strawson). Discussing a view recently proposed by Mark Johnston, she puts forward the claim that while selves do not exist, persons -- along with their essential first-person properties -- do. On Johnston's view, there is no determinate answer to the question whether a self -- which he defines as a "center of an arena of presence" -- considered at time t1 is identical to a self considered at time t2. If so, he claims, there are no such things as persisting selves; hence it is irrational to care about one's self. What's more, all practical reasons must be derived from impersonal reasons. Importantly, however, the structure of impersonal reasons does require altruism, so on Johnston's view there can still be goodness in a selfless world. In contrast, Baker argues that the kind of practical reasoning required by Johnston would not get off the ground without a first-person perspective to begin with; so in a wholly objective world Johnston's strategy for becoming good by considering another person's future interests wouldn't work. Moreover, while there might be good reasons to deny the existence of selves, the same can't be said for the existence of persons, as Baker understands them -- namely as exemplifying a first-person perspective. So on her view, there couldn't be goodness in an impersonal world; however, there is no reason to think that our world is impersonal, even if we deny the existence of selves.

Continuing the theme of moral responsibility, Thomas Pink considers the relation between ethics and psychology. He points out that it is commonly held that we can assign moral responsibility, and in particular moral blame, to people only under the assumption that they possess the capacity for self-determination. However, this capacity can take various forms and, importantly, our concept of moral responsibility does not uniquely determine what form the capacity must take for the concept to be applicable. If so, the fact that we do seem to believe in a multi-way power to determine alternatives for action cannot be traced back to our practice of assigning moral blame, which suggests that it might instead have its origins elsewhere (e.g., in our experience of human action).

The question of morality is also the topic of Churchland's paper. Drawing on her recent book Touching a Nerve, she presents a summary of research on the neural mechanisms supporting social behavior, emphasizing in particular the role of oxytocin and vasopressin. She goes on to suggest that morality is essentially a result of our basic ability for social behavior, which is "tuned up epigenetically by social interactions and by learning the social practices of the group, and by figuring out how to best deal with new social problems". On this view, our "practices for truth-telling and promise-keeping developed in much the same way as practices for boat building", namely as "a fairly obvious solution to a common social problem". Accordingly, Churchland doesn't actually say much about specifically moral values, nor does she engage with any philosophical theories of morality. While her account provides a useful summary of empirical research into sociality, it would have been good to see a more explicit discussion of how these findings are meant to bear on specific philosophical questions. Churchland hints that she takes her account to speak directly against rationalist theories of morality (and in favor of relativism). However, such claims do not follow straightforwardly from empirical observation; rather, teasing out the implications of empirical findings for philosophical questions requires careful work. There is now an increasingly large interdisciplinary literature on moral psychology pursuing precisely this kind of work; unfortunately, Churchland doesn't engage with this literature here.

One very illuminating attempt to combine philosophical considerations with insights from the empirical sciences, in particular developmental psychology, is made by Bakhurst. He engages with McDowell's "transformational view" according to which human beings are transformed from 'mere animals' into genuine thinkers by acquiring language (and hence entering into the 'space of reasons'). In order to explain this transformation, something like Wittgenstein's concept of training is often invoked. However, following Rödl, Bakhurst argues that this conception doesn't do justice to the essentially second-personal nature of the relationship between child and caregiver. Drawing on the work of Lev Vygotsky and Michael Tomasello he then proceeds to offer a revised version of the transformational view, according to which the child enters the 'space of reasons' by entering into complex social relations with others; a process which requires an active role on the part of the child and hence cannot be adequately characterized as a form of training. Bakhurst's arguments not only shed light on the nature of the child-caregiver relationship and the development of humans, but he also reminds us that animality and rationality are both part of human nature. As Bakhurst points out, this calls into question one of the core assumptions underlying a position such as Parfit's, namely that we can grasp the nature of our being as thinkers independently from our bodily being.

Now, if the notion of a thinker is tied up with reasons-responsiveness, what are we to make of claims frequently found in the neuroscientific literature to the effect that the brain 'thinks', 'decides', or 'represents the world'? Some philosophers, such as Hacker, consider such claims to be resting on, as Hacker puts it, a "mereological fallacy". According to them, intentionality can only meaningfully be ascribed to persons and not to sub-personal level processes. In contrast, Tim Crane in his paper argues that although the paradigmatic application of terms like 'representation' is at the personal level, it is not mistaken to extend their application to the sub-personal level. He suggests to think of such extensions in terms of models in the model-theoretic sense. Such models enable a better understanding of the real-world-system that is being modeled by exploiting relations of similarity in order to aid the prediction and explanation of the system's behavior. The development of such models is common practice in the empirical sciences. As such, it seems reasonable to try to interpret neuroscientific claims in this sense, especially as this allows us to take scientists' claims at face value without accusing them of committing a category mistake. However, it remains to be spelled out in more detail how such modeling processes are to be understood in this context and whether it is indeed fruitful or rather misleading to model brain processes by relating them to personal level phenomena. As Crane himself points out, this will depend on the details of the case in question.

In conclusion, what this volume demonstrates is that questions that have been at the heart of philosophy of mind for centuries are still alive and well -- and with good reason. While the distribution of topics and approaches is somewhat uneven, the volume certainly succeeds in demonstrating the liveliness of the debates in this field and the vigor and rigor with which they continue to be pursued. It brings to light the variety of views in the literature and the often opposing background assumptions that are being made, as well as -- explicitly or implicitly -- drawing attention to the numerous points of contact between discourses that are commonly treated as rather separate. Overall, it brings together some excellent contributions by outstanding thinkers and provides ample food for thought for philosophers working on questions relating to the mind, to the self, and to personhood.