Mind the Body: An Exploration of Bodily Self-Awareness

Placeholder book cover

Frédérique de Vignemont, Mind the Body: An Exploration of Bodily Self-Awareness, Oxford University Press, 2018, 263pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198735885.

Reviewed by José Luis Bermúdez, Texas A&M University


Frédérique de Vignemont's book is an extended exploration of bodily ownership and bodily self-awareness, containing a wealth of fascinating discussion of experimental work and psychopathology. In it, de Vignemont develops an interesting and important account of what is often referred to as the sense of bodily ownership -- of what it is to experience one's body-parts, and one's body as a whole, as one's own.

The sense of ownership has been much discussed in philosophical and experimental literatures. This is an area, however, where it seems easier to see the wood than the trees, and it is rather hard to pinpoint what exactly is being talked about. De Vignemont starts in Chapter 1 with the standard experimental operationalization of the phenomenon in the rubber hand illusion (RHI). In the RHI, first presented by Botvinnick and Cohen in 1998, subjects see a rubber hand being stroked while their own hand (which is out of sight) is synchronously stroked. It is a robust result that subjects report feeling sensations of touch in the rubber hand and feeling that it is their own hand when the stroking is synchronous (but not when it is asynchronous) -- or, as it is standardly put, that they have a sense of ownership for the rubber hand. So, one might think, the RHI allows us experimentally to isolate a dimension of personal-level phenomenology that is constantly present, but recessive, in ordinary experience.

De Vignemont has some sympathy for this approach. She thinks that there is a genuine phenomenal contrast between the synchronous and asynchronous conditions in the RHI -- with the sense of ownership present in the first condition and absent in the second. But she also wants to expand the frame of reference to include various forms of the converse phenomenon of disownership, including such disorders as somatoparaphrenia (where brain-damaged patients deny ownership of body-parts, particularly on the contralesional side) and depersonalization (where patients report being alienated from their own bodies and from their own thoughts). Disorders such as these present the phenomenal contrast from a different direction, as it were.

One problem with arguments from phenomenal contrast, of course, is that it is much easier to agree on the existence of a phenomenal contrast than on what that contrast actually consists in. Discussion in this area is often rather hazy on whether the sense of ownership is supposed to be a specific and recognizable feeling (like the feeling of sea-sickness or the sensation of an elevator going down) or whether it is emergent from/explicable in terms of other aspects of bodily phenomenology. This is the contrast between inflationary and deflationary accounts (see essays 6, 7, and 8 in Bermúdez, The Bodily Self, 2018 for discussion).

It is not immediately clear whether De Vignemont is offering an inflationary or a deflationary account. She does say that there is "a primitive nonconceptual awareness of bodily ownership which is over and above the experience of pressure, temperature, position, balance, movement, and so on" (p. 13). But she takes the alternative to this view (which she calls the liberal view) to be the (conservative) view that "sense of bodily ownership is something that we believe in, and not something that we experience". This latter position (which she calls the conservative view and attributes to me -- inaccurately, I have to say) seems to be a form of eliminativism about the sense of ownership.

Proponents of deflationary approaches to bodily ownership are happy to accept that there is a phenomenology of ownership. What they deny is that there is a specific feeling of ownership. For an analogy, consider happiness. There is, almost everyone would accept (perhaps even Schopenhauer), a positive phenomenology of happiness. There is something it is like to be happy. And yet the airport bookstore shelves are groaning with books proclaiming that there is no specific feeling of happiness -- the phenomenology of happiness emerges from j-ing, with each author promoting a different candidate for j-ing. Deflationary theorists think that the phenomenology of ownership is more similar to the phenomenology of happiness than to the phenomenology of, say, being punched in the stomach.

Fortunately, de Vignemont is plainly a deflationary theorist (but see further below, for an apparent change of heart in the last two chapters). I say "plainly", because if she were not, then there would be no point in her offering a positive account of what the sense of ownership consists in. She could, and should, have stopped after identifying an irreducible feeling of ownership in Chapter 1. I say "fortunately", because then we would have been deprived of the remaining nine chapters.

Still, one might reasonably wonder whether the RHI is really a useful tool for getting a fix on the sense of ownership (from the perspective of an inquiring deflationary liberal, or liberal deflationist). Since subjects in the RHI do not judge the rubber hand to be their own, whatever is going on there does not have the functional role of the "normal" sense of ownership. We judge that, say, "this hand is mine" because we have a sense of ownership for the hand. Or, to put it another way, from a deflationary perspective, we can elucidate the sense of ownership by exploring the grounds for judgments of ownership. This seems a more profitable line of inquiry than trying to identify a specific feeling that is present in the synchronous condition in the RHI and absent in the asynchronous condition -- which would be something of a fool's errand, in my opinion.

Be that as it may, de Vignemont's positive account of ownership is developed in the final two chapters of her book, where she proposes what she calls the Bodyguard hypothesis. I am no great fan of the name, which seems more appropriate to a deodorant, but the view is decidedly interesting. It is a descendant and refinement of a view that we find in Locke's Essay. In his extended discussion of personal identity in Bk. II Ch. XVII §17 Locke writes:

Self is that conscious thinking thing, (whatever Substance, made up of whether Spiritual, or Material, Simple, or Compounded, it matters not) which is sensible, or conscious of Pleasure or Pain, capable of Happiness or Misery, and so is concern'd for it self, as far as that consciousness extends.

As the parenthetical passage makes clear, Locke is less interested in explaining the metaphysics of the self, than in explaining in what we take ourselves to consist, and his mention of pleasure and pain seems clearly to indicate that he is assuming the self to be embodied -- and so his account would seem to subsume an account of bodily ownership. Framed in terms of ownership, Locke's idea is that the sense of ownership coincides with the extent of direct, personal concern.

De Vignemont's overall perspective is very Lockean. She writes: "bodily experiences involve the awareness of the body as having a special import for the self" (p. 194). And: "bodily awareness is not about the body simpliciter: it is about the body for the self" (p. 194). Her detailed account is very much continuous with Locke's focus on concern. Her model of ownership has two components -- an account of its sensorimotor underpinnings, on the one hand, and an account of the phenomenology, on the other.

So, here is the official definition of the first component of the Bodyguard hypothesis: "One experiences as one's own any body parts that are incorporated in the protective body map" (p. 182). The protective body map is a representation of the body for the purpose of identifying and responding to potential threats. As she observes, it differs from the representation of the body deployed in action. We can incorporate tools into our agentive/working body map, for example, and even feel sensations in tools (as in the proverbial example of the tip of the blind man's stick). But the whole point of a tool is that it is there to suffer in our place, as it were. It is not included in the protective body map.

When it comes to the phenomenology, she writes: "One way to interpret the bodyguard hypothesis is to assume that the sense of bodily ownership consists in bodily care" (p. 190). More specifically she writes about affective feelings, which incorporate autonomic responses, and suggests that bodily experiences are "endowed with a specific affective coloring that goes beyond their sensory phenomenology" (p. 194). De Vignemont approvingly adapts a phrase of Kathleen Akins's and suggests that bodily experiences have a "self-centered glow" (p. 205).

This last aspect of De Vignemont's position seems to me to be a step in the wrong direction. One of the merits of her book is that it substitutes careful analysis of experiments and psychopathology for unverifiable claims about phenomenology -- or, in other words, that she adopts what I earlier termed a deflationary perspective on ownership. So, it is disappointing to discover mysterious feelings creeping in in the last chapter. This sort of affectus ex machina stands in the way of the serious work of explaining what the personal-level manifestation is of the fact that a particular body-part, say, is incorporated in the protective body map. This is not going to be elucidated by appeal to the affective coloring of bodily experience. Surely what we are looking for is an account of how the body is experienced as to-be-protected. But that is part of the content of bodily experience -- it is part of how the body is represented in bodily experience. And feelings and affective coloring, if such there be, are at best qualitative aspects of bodily experience.

For these reasons, then, the first part of the Bodyguard hypothesis seems more promising than the second part, as it is currently developed. But that should not obscure the real value of this extremely well-researched and thought-provoking book, which certainly adds substantially to the interdisciplinary study of bodily awareness and bodily experience.