Mindfulness (Besinnung)

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Martin Heidegger, Mindfulness (Besinnung), trans. Parvis Emad and Thomas Kalary, Continuum, 2006, 385pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826480829.

Reviewed by Miguel de Beistegui, University of Warwick


I. The book

1. Situating the book

Besinnung is the second of a series of seven books written between 1936 and 1944, and published posthumously in the third section of the Gesamtausgabe entitled "Private Monographs and Lectures."  All those books are specifically and intimately connected with the first and most important of the series, Contributions to Philosophy: On Ereignis, written between 1936-38 and published as volume 65 of the Complete Works.  The unity of those books is both historical and thematic.  The historical unity they share is a very significant one: they were all written after the fiasco of Heidegger's tenure as the first rector of the University of Freiburg under the Nazis, and at the time when Germany was preparing itself for, and carrying out, what turned out to be the most devastating world conflict.  This historical context matters if we are to understand -- if only to criticise -- the links that Besinnung establishes between metaphysical thought and the dynamics of violence (Gewalt), power (Macht), machination (Machenschaft), and technics (Technik).  As for the thematic unity of those books, it lies in Heidegger's repeated and systematic attempt to move beyond his own thought of the 1920s, and the project of fundamental ontology in particular.  As such, they are experimental and rather tentative pieces of work, in which Heidegger asks himself many questions, and sometimes-long series of questions, to which he does not always give an answer.[1] To say that he was aware of the risks and the extraordinary difficulties involved in such an attempt (for himself as well as his readers) would be an understatement: the texts of which Besinnung is a part were planned to be released only after Heidegger's death, and only after the publication of more pedagogical texts, such as lecture courses, lectures and more exoteric monographs.  Given their complexity, we can also wonder whether they wouldn't have benefited, perhaps considerably, from prior editing.  But Heidegger was against the idea of any editing of his own work, whether by himself or by others (thus often leaving us, readers, in a delicate position).  This is how the reader is left with a number of extremely demanding passages, as well as highly unorthodox, and grammatically incorrect, statements.  Yet the patient reader will also be rewarded with remarkable insights and provoking thoughts.

2. The structure of the book

The book is divided in 28 parts, ranging from one to 40 pages, and 135 sections.  It is also followed by an appendix from Heidegger's literary remains, in which Heidegger thinks over the path of his thinking from the doctoral thesis of 1913 to the Contributions to Philosophy of 1936-1938, and offers a survey of his unpublished manuscripts.  Apart from the opening, introductory part, there doesn't seem to be an order or a progression between the various parts, which could be read in a different order (in fact, and immediately after reading the Introduction, readers might find it useful to turn to the last two parts of the book, entitled "The Be-ing-Historical Thinking and the Question of Being" and "The Be-ing-Historical Concept of Metaphysics ").  The remaining parts seem to be linked together by a series of echoes, repetitions, and variations, thus giving the (correct) impression of a thought in the making, seeking its way through uncharted territory.

3. Important themes and questions

Firstly, Besinnung (see § 10) provides a very clear description of the situation of Germany, and Europe in general, in 1938-1939: according to Heidegger, world-events unfold against the backdrop of the "military thinking that comes from the [first] World War" and "the unconditionality of armament."  Yet these are only manifestations of the "completion of the metaphysical epoch," which has turned the human into a technical (and technicised) animal, and a predator (a Worker-Warrior).  All of this is analysed as a result of what, already in Contributions, Heidegger had called die Seinsverlassenheit: the abandonment of being, in the double sense of the genitive.  The War and the Peace of our time are two sides of the same coin, two possibilities that arise from the same onto-historical configuration, and which fail to bring us face to face with what's really decisive.  The real decision, according to Heidegger, is whether we, as human beings, will continue to think our relation to the world, the earth, and others (whether in war or in peace) metaphysically (and this means as a situation in which the human, as worker and predator, is the central concern, as a situation that witnesses the convergence of power, violence, technics, and worldview), or whether we will be able to open ourselves to the essence and truth of this metaphysical situation, and this means to the essence and truth of be-ing itself, in which man can finally come into his own (and which, as we'll see shortly, implicates a unity of war and peace of a different kind, a very specific harmony between opposites engaged in a constant strife).  It's this belongingness to the truth of being which, from the start, Heidegger saw as what's distinct and of historical importance about us as human beings, what makes us who we are.  This is the question that Besinnung (along with other texts of that period) tries to reformulate with a renewed sense of urgency.  The decision, then, which is ours only to a limited extent, is whether we shall continue on the course that was set as a result of an active "forgottenness" of our essence, namely, our ex-posure to the truth of being, or to be-ing as withdrawal and abandonment, or whether something like a turning in history will take place, and a different course will be set.  And to persist in believing, as some do, that Nazism still meant the possibility of such a turning for Heidegger in 1938, is to choose to remain blind to those passages where, for example, he derides the appeal to "destiny" (Schicksal) in Nazi Germany as the "arming [Waffenstreckung] of being's abandonment of beings," or the "empty victory of the heroism of man" essentially lacking in "decision."[2]  All world-events since the end of WWII -- the armament's race, the struggle for world power, for military, economical, and ideological domination, the resurgence of religion as an illusory counter-model, the systematic exploitation and violation of resources, in which the human being itself is but a resource -- all testify to the lack of a turning or a transformation in the sense Heidegger had hoped.  From Heidegger's perspective, we are (still) living the triumph of ideology and worldview, and of the poorest, least compelling and, most of all, least liberating kind.  At the same time, the only "decision" (Entscheidung) that Heidegger contemplated is of such a magnitude, and on a plane so different from what we, metaphysical beings, still caught up in the fetters and blindness of the first beginning, normally understand by decision, and feel the need to decide about, that he simply failed to see how something decisive (although not in his sense), was at stake in the alternatives which he refused to see as real alternatives: should I be a Nazi, a communist, or a social-democrat?  Should I speak against the persecution of Jews, gypsies, members of the Church, and communists?  Or is this all irrelevant in the face of THE decision?

Secondly, Besinnung introduces key developments regarding the fundamental question (die Grundfrage), namely, that of the truth of being, and of its relation to the human and the divine in particular. 

Situated between being and beings, between earth and world, between the hidden and the manifest, or between truth and untruth, the human now emerges as the "guardian" of this "in-between" (see § 52).  This is the "space" where its essence unfolds and its fate is played out.  This in-between is what's most question-worthy; it must be constantly reopened and wrested from quick and definitive answers.  It's an inexhaustible question, for one that is open to the contingencies of time and history: it's a question for the future as well as the present.  The in-between is the space that man inherits, and the space that, somewhat paradoxically, he must make his own; in doing so, he is no longer the man of metaphysics, but the Da-sein that, since the 1920s, Heidegger had sought to think in place of the human.  Insofar as "thinking" designates the most extreme way of being a Da-sein, of being open to the in-between, it differs radically from philosophy, which has always and from the start decided in favour of beings and their beingness over the essence and truth -- the unfolding and the unconcealment -- of be-ing.  In that respect, the more powerful the human being becomes, as the being that extends its reach and power over the world and over others, the more powerless it is to dwell within the space of its own essence, the space of space-time (Zeit-raum), designated by the tension between truth and untruth, or world and earth.

As for the gods and the sacred (see §§ 70-71), I must admit to ever greater puzzlement regarding the crucial historical-destinal role Heidegger wants it to play, one perhaps born of the fact that, like most readers of Heidegger, I share a conception of the divine that is irreducibly and inextricably bound up with the God of onto-theology, the God and the gods of what he calls "the first beginning."  If some of us find Heidegger's use of the divine difficult to relate to, it's because we are unable to conceive of the holy, the divine, and the gods, from out of "the other beginning," and independently of any metaphysical point of reference.  Still: one remains utterly unconvinced by the need, or indeed the desirability, from a seynsgeschichtliche point of view, of this insistence on the gods and the sacred, on this poetic (Hölderlinian) motif, elevated to the heights of a "pole" of history and turned into a condition for the emergence of another beginning.  Even if the transcendence designated by the gods is a transcendence of the earth, it's still transcendence, and one that, as such, "thinking" must eradicate.  It's not the earth as such that's an issue, but the earth insofar as it serves as the (possibly last) refuge for transcendence, that is, for a discourse that remains messianic, and a language that is imbued with the pathos of religiosity.  What's unacceptable is the location of a future, of a history held in reserve, in a dimension that is at once secure and currently inaccessible, and intimated only by the few and the rare.  It is the backdoor through which transcendence can sneak back into the philosophical arena.  The question is the following: is the way out of nihilism, and of the death of God which Nietzsche so aptly thematised, the promise or the possibility of a God, or a set of gods, born not of the metaphysical interpretation of the world, and of our place within it, but of the truth and essence of beyng (which, as Heidegger tells us, is precisely a certain resistance to presence or refusal of manifestation)?  Or does it presuppose the active refusal and rejection of the very thought of a future and a history held in reserve, of something like an onto-historical and destinal promise?  Why, in other words, should the relation to being (and to its truth) also and de facto be a relation to the divine?

Thirdly, and in addition to the appendix entitled 'My Pathway Hitherto,' Besinnung provides valuable indications and clarifications regarding Heidegger's earlier work, and Being and Time especially (see §§ 56, 68, 79, 92-96):

Overlooking everything decisive one 'can' 'read' and use Sein und Zeit as 'anthropology' and as a kind of 'existential ethics' and so on.  But all this has nothing to do with the singularity and thoughtfulness willed in this attempt.[3] 

On the following page, Heidegger writes:

In spite of all superficial moral impressions and considering the unique question of Sein und Zeit, that is, the question concerning the truth of being, appropriateness [Eigentlichkeit] is to be grasped exclusively and always beforehand in relation to this truth as a 'manner' [Weise] to be "the t/here" in which the ap-propriation [Er-eignung] of man takes place [ereignet] through the belongingness to being and its clearing ('time').[4] 

In other words, and contrary to what seems to be the case, Being and Time is neither an anthropology, focused on the analysis of man as Dasein, nor a metaphysics, focused on the investigation regarding the beingness of beings.  Besinnung goes further still in that direction: the human being is no longer the origin of the meaning or the truth of being, as was the case in the period of fundamental ontology, but only one of the four "poles" in the tense or strifely relation of which nature and history become manifest and unfold.  By the same token, this development signals a further move away from philosophy as anthropocentrism: "man" is not the measure of all things nor, as Sartre famously claimed, and Heidegger will go on to criticise in the Letter on Humanism, the only plane on which we find ourselves.  The humanity of the humanity is rather derived from its position and role within "the fourfold" (men, gods, earth, and world).  The technological age is the age of the ultimate abandonment of the truth of being, which translates into the triumph of the human as the sole point of reference, or the standard by which everything else is measured.  Besinnung belongs in the "crossing" into the other beginning inasmuch as it tries to dislodge the human from its central position -- one that Heidegger believes to be destructive, for the human itself as well as for the world -- and to open it up, historically and existentially, to its forgotten essence. This forgottenness, we are told in § 68 ("The Forgottenness of Be-ing"), thus allowing us to clarify what Being and Time meant when claiming that the question of being had been "forgotten," is a forgottenness that is residual and irreducible, and which "man can never eliminate," simply because it is not a human affair to begin with.  Rather it is the forgottenness of be-ing, in the double sense of the genitive.

Fourthly, and intimately linked to the previous point, are those illuminating pages (Parts XXVII and XXVIII) regarding the difference and the relation between "thinking," as it arises from the essence of truth, and "metaphysics," as the effect of the non-essence or the forgottenness of truth.  The difference that is clarified, therefore, is that, already introduced in Contributions, and developed further here, between the first beginning (which covers the whole of our Western, metaphysical history) and the other beginning, in which the first beginning is taken up again, but from the point of view of its unthought, forgotten essence (the truth of be-ing).  What is clarified, therefore, is the intimate connection between the two beginnings, as well as the abyss that separates them, and the leap that is required in order to move from the first to the second.

Finally, and most interestingly perhaps, Besinnung brings together a number of decisive threads introduced in Contributions and, in doing so, paves the way for Heidegger's later work from the 1950s and 60s (especially "Die Sprache," Identity and Difference, and "Time and Being").  As such, it is a decisive stage in the profound transformation of the question of being (Seinsfrage) into the question of Ereignis, and in the further conception of Ereignis as Austrag.  This latter term designates something like an "accord," or an "adjustment," and is understood in a very Heraclitean way as the harmony or coming together of opposites.  It designates the accord born of a very specific tension, namely, that between world and earth in their strife (Streit) and between gods and human beings in their en-counter (Entgegnung).  In thus understanding the working of Ereignis, Heidegger also opens up the further possibility -- a possibility he begins to develop in the volume immediately following Besinnung,[5] but which becomes the focus of his thought in the 1950s and 60s -- of understanding the truth of being as dif-ference (Unter-schied), that is, as the inter-stice between the various forces I've just evoked.  "Be-ing" is now the "between" that is the very ground for all distinctions (as distinctions of the human logos), and the space of de-cision itself (Ent-scheidung), which Heidegger has been concerned to identify and thematise ever since Being and Time and its concept of Entschlossenheit.  It has now become a question of thinking being as the originary rift that gathers together (versammelt) what it separates (scheidet), as the unity of a double process that holds together by holding apart. This is how dif-ference is also intimacy (Innigkeit), or the unity of a harmonious, productive and irreducible tension.  Ultimately, Besinnung is a crucial link in the chain that runs from Being and Time to "Time and Being," from the problematic of the ontico-ontological difference (Differenz) to that of being as difference (Unterschied).  This, I believe, is where its greatest virtue lies.  The possibilities that it opens up for ontology, aesthetics, and even ethics are innumerable, and can be extended far beyond Heidegger's own thought.  Unfortunately, the relevant section (XXVI) is one of the most demanding of the entire book, and perhaps the most inadequately translated.

II. The translation

Translating Heidegger is a generally demanding and at times thankless task.  Translating the "private monographs" of the late 1930s is a daunting one.  Therefore one can only hail the courage and effort of those who decide to take it on.  One can and must do so especially in the light of the restrictions imposed by Heidegger's will on the editors and the translators of the Gesamtausgabe, which forbid any kind of technical or scholarly apparatus that would help clarify or justify the use or translation of certain terms. That being said, there are many ways in which one can translate Heidegger's texts, many decisions and strategies that can be adopted.  These need to be highlighted and discussed, and this is what I shall do in the second part of this review.

Let me begin with a few general remarks.  At times and, unsurprisingly, in those passages where Heidegger reflects upon his own path of thinking, and his first attempt at opening up the question concerning the truth of being in the period of Being and Time, the translation reads very well: it is accurate, and makes sense without forcing the reader to go to the German text for clarification (a kind of translation in reverse which, alas, this reviewer found himself condemned to on too many occasions).  Those are also the passages where Heidegger's own thought is the clearest, first because it benefits from his retrospective analysis, and second because we, as readers, are more familiar with the concepts and themes of that period. At other times, though, and specifically in the passages that are more experimental, more tentative, and in which Heidegger tries to give a sense of the new thought and the new beginning he has in mind, the translation defies comprehension -- far more so than does the German (see pp. 32, 56, 69, 198, 273-74).  There is so much violence one can exercise on language before it begins to give and plunge into nonsense. To be sure, Heidegger's German often feels foreign to a German ear.  Still, what's uncanny, slightly odd, or provoking, differs from what's simply nonsensical.  Too often, the translators decide to push Heidegger's language over the edge, into a language that is incomprehensible.  Rather than accept that a number of Heidegger's terms need to be translated differently, according to the context and the various meanings such terms can evoke in the original, the translators decide to use or, worse still, create a word in English that's supposed to encompass the various German meanings, but which fails to evoke anything concrete to the Anglophone ear.

Let me now review some of those choices and decisions and, in some instances, offer alternatives.  In what follows, I've decided to limit myself to remarks and suggestions regarding Heidegger's use of prefixes, prepositions, and nouns.

1. Prefixes

a. Ab-

The translators almost always translate the prefix ab- with the English ab-.  This is how der Ab-grund -- normally understood to mean the "abyss" -- becomes the ab-ground.  The problem with Ab-ground, independently of the fact, not to be disregarded in our view, that it's not an English word, is that it can't make any sense to anyone who doesn't already know both German and (in particular) the function of the prefix ab-, anyone, that is, who can't read Ab-grund instead of ab-ground.  But then, may we ask, why bother translating Heidegger's text in the first place?  To an anglophile ear, ab-ground evokes neither the abyssal nor a specific kind of grounding.  It doesn't evoke anything at all. How should we translate it, then?  Perhaps we should begin by recognising that something must be lost in English, but not the most significant aspect of the word in question.  This is how, depending on the context, Abgrund could be translated as "abyss" or "abyssal ground," and "Das Abhafte des Grundes," which clarifies the term Ab-grund and emphasises the nature of the ground as the ground that withdraws or stays away (as in its ab-sence), as "the ab-sence of ground," or "the withdrawing of ground."  As for die Abgründigkeit, it is entirely mysterious why it should be translated as "holding unto abground," rather than as "abyssality" and/or "the abyssality of ground."

b. Ur-

In this instance, the translators have again opted in favour of a systematically literal translation, as in "urground," a puzzling term indeed.  Urgrund normally designates the ground of all grounds, the primordial ground.  It is constructed like a large number of other words in German, like Uranfang (first beginning), Ureltern (fathers of humankind, Adam and Eve), Urmensch (the first man or human being), or Ursprache (earliest language), for which there are no equivalents in English.  Why, then, force the English language in that direction?  To be sure, the OED mentions ur- as a prefix that can denote what's "primitive, original, earliest", but only in a few words ("ur-Hamlet," "ur-origin," and "ur-stock"), which the vast majority of Anglophones will have never heard.

c. Er-

This is another prefix, which the translators discuss in their Foreword, applying again the principle of systematic literalness.  In this instance, er- is translated as en-.  This is of course a crucial issue, given the centrality of the notion of Ereignis for Heidegger, to which we'll return in a moment.  The prefix er- normally denotes agency, emphasises the activity or the doing of a verb, its power to bring something about, or to be brought about by the subject of the sentence.  Let me also note, in passing, that some prefixes (though not er) being separable in German, it is less strange to see them hyphenated than in English.  Now with "being-historical words," to use the jargon of the translators, we are told that the prefix doesn't just emphasise or enhance the infinitive, but indicates a new direction, a new meaning, and that the words they help form "say much more than what the infinitives alone say or imply".  This is how erdenken becomes "enthinking," er-sagen "en-saying," er-sehen "en-seeing," er-wesen "en-swaying," and erglühen (which means to glow) "englowing"!  Most importantly, though, this is how Ereignis becomes enowning. True, er-sagen and er-wesen aren't proper German.  But erdenken, ersehen and Ereignis are (as is erglühen).  Enthinking, en-saying, en-seeing, en-swaying and en-owning, to say nothing of englowing, simply don't exist in English, or have any way of making sense to an Anglophone ear.  They're just silly.  It's also true that, when hyphenating existing words in that way, or even adding the prefix 'er' to some other words, Heidegger wants to stress the connection with Ereignis, in other words, the fact that there is a mode of speaking, seeing, and comporting oneself that stems not from lived experience (Erlebnis), from subjectivity as the source of experience, but from a singular openness and attunement to the truth of being (and this is experience in the genuine sense, the experience of Da-sein in the sense of Erfahrung).  It's the latter that can overcome the dictates, habits and worldviews of machination, and invent another thinking.  Now from the point of view of translation, is there a way to suggest that link?  Given the way prefixes work in English, and the lack of a direct equivalent of er- in English, I don't think that link can be established by a systematic use of en- as a substitute.  Er-sagen and er-sehen could be something like "saying," "speaking" or "seeing" in accord with Ereignis, or even from Ereignis.  But by systematically rendering one German prefix with another in English, we are hoping that English neologisms will begin to mean something they simply cannot mean.

2. Prepositions

Far too much is read into some prepositions, as in (whether followed by the accusative or the dative) and zu. This is how das Seiende im Ganzen, which would normally be understood to mean beings as a whole or in their totality, becomes "beings in the whole."  What whole would that be?  It's not as if there were beings, and something else, namely, the whole.  Beings as a whole, in their totality is, I believe, exactly what Heidegger means, as his own translation of Periander's to pan on the first page of Besinnung indicates. 

The German in, followed this time by the accusative, generates the systematic and highly confusing use of unto, which is also used sometimes to translate zu. Thus, we read: "the clearing frees all the swaying of the en-owned unto the ab-ground of en-owning;" "the accepted liberation unto a distress"; "to think unto the truth of be-ing"; "the pathways unto en-grounding the truth of be-ing"; "a projecting-open [Entwurf] that throws itself unto the opening;" "being gifts [verschenkt] its truth unto beings," or "a hint unto the sway of be-ing as en-owning."  "Unto" is even used to translate part of the technical noun Entrückung: instead of designating the rapture, or the enrapturing of time-space (a phenomenon that Heidegger once designated as ecstasies, and used to define the temporality of existence), it becomes the removal-unto.  In English, as in any other language, certain verbs command certain prepositions, and there is no way around them: to begin to construct verbs with prepositions other than their own is to fall into nonsense.  No matter how many times we repeat "thinking," "freeing," or "giving" unto, we fail to bring anything meaningful to mind.

3.  Names

            There is a wealth of terms used in Besinnung that would require discussion.  Let me address problems regarding the translation of three names only.

a.  Ereignis

Is Ereignis one of those words that we should leave untranslated?  If we are to listen to Heidegger, the answer is yes, since he declared the word untranslatable.  There is already a precedent in that respect: Dasein is usually left untranslated in English.  But the problem is that Ereignis is a word that contains many other words within it, and especially the verbs ereignen, ent-eignen, übereignen, and zueignen.  In a way, and in certain contexts, we find ourselves forced to translate Ereignis, because of the many other verbs and names associated with it.  Is "en-owning" the correct translation, then?  Not believing that the prefix en- does any work in that neologism, I can't support such a translation.  In addition, how can one forget entirely the fact that Ereignis normally means "event," and that there are very good reasons to believe that, by understanding Sein verbally, and transitively, Ereignis does designate something like the recurrent event of being, as the giving or granting of ownness or properness? This is why I suggest "event of ap-propriation" as a possible translation.  According to the OED, "to appropriate" means "to make something over to someone as his own."  This is the sense that we need to bear in mind.  Ap-propriation signals the granting of the own, of the proper.  The other, more common sense of the term, on the other hand, needs to be ignored, for Heidegger's Ereignis does not involve the act of taking possession of something for one's own.  Ereignis can be understood as an event only to the extent that it is a granting of the proper or the own, and not in the sense of an actual event, no matter how great, taking place in space and time (for Ereignis is also the event or the unfolding of time-space, the advent of History).  It's an event that is forever recurring, and recurring differently: the different ways in which this event recurs are what Heidegger calls "epochs."  In the case of the event of ap-propriation, I believe hyphenation is justified: it emphasises the process by which man and being are mutually and reciprocally brought into their own, and erases the temptation to understand appropriation as a form of violent reduction of something external and different to something like a pre-given and self-enclosed identity.  At the same time, it retains the link -- crucial, in my view -- with the ordinary sense of the word, that is, the event.  Most of all, it has the advantage of evoking something that is not altogether unfamiliar to the Anglophone ear.

b. Wesen

The translators justify their decision to render Wesen as "sway" in their Foreword.[6]  It's a justification I cannot endorse. To be sure, Wesen doesn't mean essence in the metaphysical, technical sense (as essentia).  But it does refer to being in the verbal sense: it designates the mode of being, of unfolding that belongs to something, its style as it were.  In middle German, wesen means sein (to be), sich aufhalten (to comport oneself), geschehen (to take place or occur).  In old German, wesan, from which wesen is derived, means verweilen, wohnen, übernachten: to dwell or inhabit.  Das Wesen, then, designates the being of something in the manner of its being, unfolding or dwelling.  To speak of the Wesen des Seyns, therefore, is to speak of the way in which it unfolds, happens, lingers -- of the way in which it is.  It is to speak of its esse or its essence, but in terms of its eventfulness or event-ness, its temporality and its spatiality.  So, to say that "beyng is" is to recognise that "beyng and beyng alone brings about [or un-folds: er-west] its own essence [Wesen]."  But who can understand "be-ing and only be-ing en-sways its own sway?"  To sway could well translate sich wiegen, schwanken, schwenken, or even schwingen (and Contributions to Philosophy does speak of Ereignis in terms of a Schwingung, an oscillation between two tendencies, one towards the open and the manifest, the other towards withdrawal and sheltering), but not wesen.

c. Auseinandersetzung

With Auseinandersetzung as "dissociating exposition" we reach etymological mania, and total absurdity: contrary to what the translators want us to believe, it is a question of engaging with, and confronting, the major philosophies and systems of our tradition, in the way that Heidegger has done from the start, that is, by bringing out the unthought of the thought or system in question, with the question of the truth of being as his guiding thread.  It's a matter of Aufbau, of deconstruction or destructuring.  I fail to see what's dissociative about this enterprise, and why it should be defined as an exposition.

Concluding remarks regarding the translation:

The broader issue, it seems to me, is whether what Heidegger calls "thinking that stems from the history of be-ing" or "onto-historical thinking" (seynsgeschichtliche Denken), or simply "thinking," as opposed to metaphysics, commands a relation to language that is incommensurable with its ordinary and/or philosophical use.  The translators seem to be convinced that this is indeed the case.  They refer to "being-historical thinking," as if Heidegger himself were thinking and writing from the other side, as if that space had actually been opened up and secured.  As a result, they burn the bridges still attaching us to the language of metaphysics -- the only language there is, as Heidegger finally recognised -- and entertain the belief -- I would claim the illusion -- that, were we to follow their highly idiosyncratic language, and their dis-located syntax, we would finally reach the shores of Heideggeriana, this promised land of thought.  But I'm not sure Heidegger ever reached the promised land, or ever saw himself anywhere than in the middle of the Red Sea, attempting to free a way (Weg) through the present, endlessly struggling, always retaining some link with this side of metaphysics, never crossing the line, only ever treading it. The texts from the late 1930s, including Besinnung, are only preparatory.  They are only intimations of the "other beginning."  They do not take us through the looking glass, but open up possibilities for a "crossing" into non-metaphysical thought.  This, I believe, is where there is a deep disagreement regarding what Heidegger sought to achieve, and where serious doubts regarding the translators' strategy -- one that I would qualify as over-translation (translating over and beyond Heidegger's own German, and not just across idiomatic boundaries) -- can be raised.  The problem with that hermeneutic-philosophical decision is that it leaves the reader in a kind of limbo, where words no longer retain any connection with their everyday or technical usage, where grammar and syntax are no longer upheld as the vehicle of sense, where, in short, language -- at least at the philosophically most decisive moments -- can be entirely reinvented, and words rechristened according to the fancy of the demiurge.  Heidegger can and must be translated differently.


[1] A good example would be Mindfulness, pp. 175-176.

[2] Mindfulness, p. 22.

[3] Mindfulness, p. 123.  Translation modified.

[4] Mindfulness, p. 124.  Translation modified.

[5] Metaphysik und Nihilismus, GA 67, "Die Überwindung der Metaphysik," §§ 73-81 ("Die Unterscheidung").

[6] Mindfulness, pp. xxxvi-xxxvii.