Minding Time: A Philosophical and Theoretical Approach to the Psychology of Time

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Carlos Montemayor, Minding Time: A Philosophical and Theoretical Approach to the Psychology of Time, Brill, 2013, 154 pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004228917.

Reviewed by Ulrich Meyer, Colgate University


This is a book about the psychology of temporal cognition, written by a philosopher. As the author rightly notes in the introduction, "Philosophers have made many tentative empirical claims about time cognition, but very few have taken into account all the current scientific evidence" (p. 5). Carlos Montemayor aims to fill this lacuna in the philosophical literature.

Apart from the introductory chapter, the book consists of three chapters of about forty pages each. Chapter II begins with the general question of how to measure time, and then presents two types of clocks. Periodic clocks rely on uniform cyclical processes, such as a swinging pendulum, or the revolutions of the earth around its axis. Interval clocks are based on uniform (but non-cyclical) accumulation or decay processes, such as the growth of tree rings, or the flow of sand in an hourglass. Montemayor claims that both types of clock are realized in living organisms and then considers the empirical question of how they interact with one another. Chapter III argues that organisms with such internal clocks possess (perhaps non-linguistic) clock representations that faithfully represent objective temporal structure. Chapter IV presents a "novel two-phase model of the present." The sensorial present is generated by simultaneity widows, which are non-zero time intervals during which all events are judged simultaneous; the phenomenal present "integrates sequential information into a single unified experience" (p. 125).

From p. 40 on, the focus shifts from a general discussion of chronometry to the specific biological bases of temporal cognition. These I found to be the most rewarding parts of the book. There were many instances where I wished that Montemayor had provided a more detailed account of the remarkable ways in which animals process temporal information, rather than refer to the specialist literature on this subject matter. However, his main contention is that these empirical discoveries are philosophically important (rather than merely interesting in their own right), and it is at that point that I think a stronger case could have been made.

The main fault line in the philosophy of time runs between those who think that there is something metaphysically special about the present, and that time genuinely flows ("A-theorists"); and those who reject both claims ("B-theorists"). A-theorists typically offer two types of argument for their position. The metaphysical argument claims that only an A-theory of time can give an account of genuine change. The phenomenological argument contends that A-theories of time are supported by our own first-person experience of time: present objects are "vivid" in a way that past and future ones are not, and the passage of time is said to be something that we perceive directly. B-theorists reject both arguments. They do not agree that genuine change requires an A-theory of time, and they try to explain away the first-person evidence for A-theories as either illusory or flatly mistaken.

One might expect a philosophically informed discussion of human temporal cognition to shed some light on the phenomenological argument, but this is not how Minding Time plays out. Rather than begin with a neutral stance on the relation between the "human time" in which our own temporal experiences unfold, and the "physical time" that forms the subject matter of physical theories, Montemayor assumes from the outset that physics gives a complete account of the nature of time. He rejects any appeal to introspection about temporal phenomenology as incompatible with his scientific methodology (ch. I; p. 109). On his view, the task of a theory of temporal cognition is to investigate how organisms represent the features of an observer-independent temporal reality that is given by our best physical theories.

Such an approach is bound to limit the philosophical impact of the investigation. A-theorists will readily grant that physical theories do little to support their views about time. After all, such theories do not even mention the words 'present' or 'flow'. But A-theorists will also insist that there is more to time than our physical theories let on, and that some of these additional features can be identified in our own conscious experiences. To rule out any introspective appeal to temporal phenomenology therefore not only deprives A-theorists of one of their main arguments, it also eliminates the only part of the debate that is actually concerned with the way humans perceive time.

Being a B-theorist myself, I would be happy to accept the conclusion that the A-theory is misguided, but I am not sure that we can acquire new insight into the debate if we assume from the outset that one side is wrong. Moreover, if we agree to ignore the phenomenological argument then it is no longer clear to me why philosophers of time should care about the details of human temporal cognition. At best, such an investigation would be a mop-up operation that tries to explain how an illusion arises that we all along agreed was an illusion. For B-theorists, the important part is to defeat the A-theory, not to settle the precise details of how temporal illusions arise. In a number of instances, such as the discussion of the specious present in Section 4.3, Montemayor defends positions that differ in subtle ways from the accounts that many B-theorists simply made up (without bothering to read the empirical literature on temporal cognition). It would have been helpful to hear more about why he believes that these minor differences are philosophically important, and what additional insight they provide on the debates in the philosophy of time.

Montemayor nicely lays out how temporal cognition takes many different forms, even within one and the same animal, and how the different modes of temporal cognition interact. (See, e.g., the illuminating discussion of cross-modal simultaneity windows in Section 4.1.) But many aspects of temporal cognition do not feature prominently in philosophical disputes about time. For instance, the long Chapter II is about measurement of durations, which is an issue that A- and B-theorists largely agree on. On the other hand, the book says very little about the flow of time, and most of the discussion in Chapter IV is really about perceptions of simultaneity, rather than the contentious question of whether there is a principled difference between the present and past and future times.

In closing, let me briefly comment on two specific issues. The first concerns Weber's Law, according to which the just-noticeable difference between  two stimuli is proportional to the magnitude of the stimuli. Section 2.3 takes this to mean that any time measurement is subject to a tradeoff between scale and resolution, and that the ability to measure longer time intervals must be bought with a sacrifice of precision (p. 22; see also p. 49). I do not think this is right. To get a higher resolution with an hourglass, we use finer sand. To measure longer durations, we use more sand. Nothing prevents us from getting both, by using a larger quantity of finer sand. Weber's law is an empirical generalization about actually realized biological clocks, not a physical law of chronometry.

The second issue concerns the isomorphism thesis defended in Section 3.1. Montemayor argues that the clock representations possessed by organisms with internal interval clocks are detailed enough to be isomorphic to intervals on the real line. If that were right, though, then humans and other animals would have aleph-one many clock representations. That not only seems to be an implausible claim about the informational capacity of the human nervous system, it also appears to be incompatible with claims that Montemayor himself makes elsewhere in the book. If the isomorphism thesis were true then all clock representations would have maximal resolution, undermining Montemayor's (and Weber's) thesis that there is a scale-resolution trade-off. Similarly, if the claims about non-zero simultaneity windows in Section 4.2 are right, then there is a non-zero lower bound on possible temporal resolution, again ruling out aleph-one many clock representations.

When I arrived at the end of the book, I felt that I had learned a lot about the biology of temporal cognition, but I was less sure how this newly acquired knowledge might change or deepen my understanding of debates in the philosophy of time. Partially, this might be due to the fact that Minding Time makes surprisingly little contact with the standard literature on the philosophy of time, and often hints at philosophical implications rather than develop them in detail. But I also suspect that many of the issues addressed are ultimately of more interest to philosophers of mind and psychology (who are concerned with processes that take place in time) than they are to philosophers of time (who are interested in the nature of time itself).